Scientism: The New Orthodoxy

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Richard N. Williams and Daniel N. Robinson (eds.), Scientism: The New Orthodoxy, Bloomsbury, 2015, 200pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472571106.

Reviewed by Steven Horst, Wesleyan University


This volume consists of an introduction and eight essays, each critical of something described as scientism. 'Scientism', however, is a term used only by its critics -- nobody describes his or her own views as scientistic. Several of the authors provide their own accounts, which differ in detail but echo common themes. In the Introduction, Richard Williams identifies four distinguishing features:

1.      "only certifiably scientific knowledge counts as real knowledge. All else is mere opinion or nonsense." (p. 6)

2.     "the methods and assumptions underlying the natural sciences, including epistemological and metaphysical doctrines, are appropriate for all sciences, including, prominently, the social and human sciences. A corollary doctrine is that the arts, if they seek to be more than myth and self-expression, must somehow be brought under the umbrella of science." (p. 6)

3.     "Scientism exudes and promotes an exaggerated confidence in science . . . to produce knowledge and solve the problems facing humanity." (pp. 6-7)

4.     "Scientism assumes, and requires a naturalist, materialist, rather mechanistic metaphysics. Such a metaphysics is so important to scientism that it has become a core feature of the orthodoxy of scientism. Commitment to this metaphysics is preeminent among the ideas that give energy to defenders and promulgators of scientism . . . . It is scientism's insistence on naturalist, materialist, metaphysical orthodoxy that is of most concern to many of its thoughtful critics." (p. 7)

James K. A. Smith offers a more succinct but compatible summary (pp. 178-9), and Daniel Robinson's version adds features more specific to the Logical Empiricist programme: the assumption that both natural and human sciences employ Deductive-Nomological explanation and the view that all legitimate claims would in principle be translatable into the language of physics, leading to a forced choice between reduction and elimination. (pp. 28-29)

We can see here themes that are amply illustrated, though not necessarily all of them together, in the popular works of some scientists who have become media figures. (Carl Sagan, Richard Dawkins, Stephen Pinker, and V.S. Ramachandran are each mentioned by one or more authors.) They are also issues that have played out in a number of episodes in the history of the sciences and humanities -- to mention a few important examples: the debates (first within the nineteenth century German academy and later within Logical Empiricism) about whether the human sciences operate in the same way as the natural sciences (with attendant questions about their legitimacy), claims of some of the Logical Positivists that ethical assertions are literally meaningless, the "science wars", the science/religion debates and the metanarratives spun around them, and recent attempts in such fields as evolutionary psychology and neuroscience to make decisive contributions to (or perhaps even to replace) philosophical discussions of free will, subjectivity, agency, ethics, moral psychology, and aesthetics.

Unsurprisingly, philosophers of a number of distinct schools have historically taken issue with what they have seen as the overreach of claims based in the natural sciences. And while the essays are (to the best of my knowledge) new, several recapitulate familiar lines of thought grounded in much older conversations. Roger Scruton's approach traces its roots to Dilthey's late ninetheenth century Verstehen theory, Robinson draws upon William Dray's (1957) interpretivist response to the Deductive-Nomological model of explanation, and Peter Hacker upon Wittgenstein's linguistic philosophy. Lawrence Principe offers historical perspective on the science/religion dialog, and James Smith offers a more radical critique of it from what might be called a broadly post-modern perspective. Bas van Fraassen and Richard Swinburne offer more topical discussions within epistemology of science and analytic metaphysics respectively -- van Fraassen contrasting the sort of empiricism he endorses with a form of naturalism advocated preeminently by Penelope Maddy and Swinburne arguing against physical determinism. Kenneth Schaffner discusses the emergence of neuroethics, albeit without the kind of pointed attack upon scientism that unites the other articles.

Most of the book is thus devoted to a combination of (a) discussions of the history of some form of scientism and (b) examples of the types of criticisms scientism has drawn from different corners of philosophy. The diversity of the authors' philosophical perspectives is as impressive as their credentials. This diversity is both a plus and a minus. On the positive side, the volume could serve as a kind of sampler of the ways philosophers of different schools have found fault with a common target. I could (bracketing the book's prohibitively high price tag) imagine the collection being used fruitfully in a seminar where, in addition to the analyses and arguments of the individual articles, attention could be given to their different philosophical backgrounds and to the large open question of how they relate to one another once we have gotten beyond their common antipathy towards scientism. On the other hand, there was perhaps an opportunity missed in neither providing such contextualization nor trying to draw out connections and points of potential conflict. Verstehen theory, Wittgenstein, empiricist epistemology, and analytic metaphysics make peculiar bedfellows, and the question of how (or indeed if) the collection adds up to more than a pastiche united only by a common foe is left to the reader to figure out.

I think there actually is an interesting metanarrative that can be constructed around several of the chapters. It is occasioned by Smith's essay, which concludes the volume and helps weave together two strands running through other chapters. The first strand is found in the articles by Robinson, Scruton, and Hacker, who each identify, at a theoretical level, problems with attempts to fit human self-understanding into the framework of the natural sciences. Principe's article introduces a second strand, as he presents a history of engagements between science and theology which sheds light upon the peculiar prominence of scientism on the contemporary scene. Smith, whose article completes the book, draws these two strands together, recommending an alternative approach to philosophy of science which, while no less hostile to scientism, forces us to rethink older assumptions about what differentiates natural science from both the human sciences and the humanities and also recontextualizes the relationship between science and theology.

Hacker, one of the preeminent exponents of a form of Wittgensteinian philosophy, takes neuroscientists to task for speaking beyond their scientific competence and for making fundamental lapses of analysis in attributing to brains (or to parts of brains) activities that can felicitously be attributed only to whole persons. There is no question but that various sorts of brain activity play a role in a human person's thinking, intending, or representing. But to say on the basis of this that brains are the subjects of these activities involves a fundamental conceptual confusion, one which leads to a false confidence that the natural sciences can explain such historical and cultural facts as why Hannibal did not attack Rome after the battle of Cannae or why Raphael painted Democritus with boots on. (p. 98) The problem is not that neuroscience gives false answers to such questions but that any answers it might give are incoherent. Indeed, they involve the same problems that impugn Cartesian dualism: brains are no more the proper logical subjects to figure in such explanations than are Cartesian souls. This type of analysis was of course far more the staple of philosophical writing half a century ago, but Hacker's examples from recent publications of what a previous generation might have called logical howlers and category errors show that the need for it has not gone away.

But while linguistic analysis may help dissolve illusions of, say, a too-easy identification of the thinking of persons with brains or brain activity, it leaves open all the question of how the things we can legitimately say about neural phenomena may be related to the things properly said of persons. Can the one be used to explain the other? (And if so, how? Reductively? Nomically? Mechanistically?) Does one supervene upon the other? If these questions simply disappear upon grammatical inspection, the problem is not simply that some neuroscientists are insufficiently careful in their use of language; rather, it would mean that just about everything that has been written in philosophy of mind and of cognitive science has been based upon elementary errors.

The essays by Scruton and Robinson offer critiques from within interpretivist traditions that hold that mental, historical, and cultural phenomena require very different sorts of understanding from those found in the natural sciences. Robinson's target is a form of scientism based upon views of science developed within Logical Positivism and Empiricism, while Scruton's analysis is rooted more in the older opposition between Naturwissenschaften and Geisteswissenschaften. Their main lines of argument are historically familiar: there are perfectly good ways of understanding psychological, cultural, and historical events that are very different in form from physical laws, are not reducible to physical laws, and without which we would be left with no explanation at all of their subjects. I think the basic line of criticism has always been cogent, though Robinson's and Scruton's positions are not identical. Arguments to similar conclusions can also be found in the works of advocates of the autonomy of the special sciences, such as Jerry Fodor. But whereas Fodor's point is that psychology has its own irreducible laws, Robinson and Scruton hold that the relevant forms of understanding of psychological, cultural, and historical phenomena are not nomic. They seem to part with one another on the further question of whether they are really matters for explanation at all. Robinson speaks of different forms of explanation, but Scruton writes (in speaking of the example of understanding a work of art, though I take it this stands in as proxy for a broader range of cultural phenomena) that we "are not asking for an explanation of something, but for a description". (p. 137) (Additionally, I found it interesting that Robinson quoted Donald Davidson alongside Dray, as Davidson's anomalous monism was in part intended as an alternative to Dray's view, and Davidson advocated token identity and supervenience. This seems an important difference, as Robinson says (p. 29) that the physicalist's real issue is about ontology rather than understanding.)

Principe and Smith address different aspects of the dialogue between science and religion. Principe examines the roots of the metaphor of "warfare" between science and religion, introduced by John Draper (1874) and Andrew White (1896) more than a century ago and still employed by advocates of scientism in the public sphere. Draper's and White's accounts, as Principe notes, are not taken seriously by contemporary historians of science, but the "warfare" meme has become embedded in the public imagination and is drawn upon freely in the rhetoric of science/religion debates. Principe draws plausible parallels between the attitude and rhetoric of scientism and that of its chief opponent in public diatribes, fundamentalism. Just as fundamentalism began as an early twentieth century reaction against perceived threats from "higher criticism" in Biblical studies, the cult of science, claims Principe, emerged in the late twentieth century in response to postmodern critiques and the science wars, which "assailed the supposedly uniquely authoritative character of science and its societal role, as well as its methodological claims" (p. 54), as well as political opposition by Christian fundamentalists to the teaching of evolution and modern cosmogony.

Thus, in the late twentieth century, science found itself -- to the surprise of its practitioners -- under threat. Since scientists now rely on massive government funding, these issues have much more than merely academic significance, for scientists find not only their authority challenged, but also the governmental patronage crucial for their work jeopardized. In short, they find themselves unexpectedly in an unstable and political position -- one strikingly similar to that of religious fundamentalists. One response has been largely the same -- a hardening of position and a crusading mentality, one that overextends science's applicability and attacks those groups and ideas perceived as adversaries or competitors. (p. 54)

Smith's essay -- which I regard as both the most interesting and the most original in the collection -- brings together the two strands of philosophy of science and the science/religion dialog by calling into question the assumption that "science" simply reports the givens of nature (however hard-won the knowledge of them might be), while religion or theology is a cultural product, fraught (or radiant) with interpretation and values. Smith stresses how this assumption has often put theists on a defensive footing, but for purposes of relating the articles in the collection, it is equally important that this is the kind of division between a natural science of facts and laws and the realm of culture and Geist that is supposed in Robinson's and Scruton's articles.

What Smith emphasizes is that science is first and foremost a human practice -- as he calls it, a "cultural performance" -- that is just as situated, interpretive, and normative as any other, a view he develops with the help of what I regard as some of the best contemporary synthesis of analytic and Continental epistemology and philosophy of science. (Rouse 1996, 2002) The sciences do, of course, make claims about the world; science is beholden to the results of experiment, and other epistemic claims are at least partially beholden to these results as well. But any area of science also conceptualizes the world in particular ways, and these ways of framing the phenomena are tied on the one hand to practices for interacting and intervening and on the other hand to ways they matter. From this Smith draws trenchant conclusions for dialog between science and theology:

One important implication of recognizing science as culture is a leveling of the playing field in the theology/science dialogue. While it might be the case that theology must rightly be constrained by the "givenness" of nature -- the world that pushes back on our claims -- that is not the same as saying that theology must bow at the feet of science. We need to recognize a distinction between science and nature, a distinction too often erased. Science is not a transparent magnifying glass or pristine conduit that delivers nature "as it really is." Science is a cultural institution (or, better, a constellation of cultural institutions) that is, of course, especially attentive to nature, is interested in describing and perhaps even explaining nature, and exposes itself to nature's pushback through the rigors and disciplines of experimentation and observation. But that doesn't make science "natural." It remains a cultural level of human making. And in this respect, it is in the same boat as theology (and literature and sociology and . . . ) . . . . Theology should no longer feel that it has to defer to science as if it was thereby subjecting itself to nature or "reality" (as in, "science tells us . . . "). While theological claims are rightly disciplined by the ways in which the givenness of the world "pushes back" on our claims, this is not synonymous with being disciplined by science. Furthermore, religious communities bear witness to the fact that the "push back" we feel from the cosmos also includes a pressure felt from the transcendent, from eternity -- precisely the "push back" that scientism wants to ignore. (p. 182)

Overall, the volume provides points of entry into the worries philosophers of several different schools have raised about scientism. Readers who have encountered attempts to adjudicate social-scientific, humanistic, or religious claims on the basis of the natural sciences and come away thinking something is amiss will find here several candidate diagnoses and critiques, though few of the articles break new ground, and unfortunately little attempt is made to situate the chapters with respect to one another in terms of their origins in different philosophical traditions or the issues between them. The book's optimal home might be courses in which the individual articles could provide occasion for such contextualization and further critical discussion.


Dray, W. (1957), Laws and Explanation in History. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Draper, J.W. (1874), History of the Conflict Between Religion and Science. New York: D. Appleton.

Rouse, J. (1996), Engaging Science: How to Understand Its Practices Philosophically. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

Rouse, J. (2002), How Scientific Practices Matter: Reclaiming Philosophical Naturalism. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

White, A.D. (1896), History of the Warfare of Science with Theology (2 vols.). New York: D. Appleton.