Scottish Philosophy in the Eighteenth Century, Volume I: Morals, Politics, Art, Religion

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Aaron Garrett and James A. Harris (eds.), Scottish Philosophy in the Eighteenth Century, Volume I: Morals, Politics, Art, Religion, Oxford University Press, 2015, 482pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199560677.

Reviewed by  Laurent Jaffro, Université Paris 1 Panthéon-Sorbonne


This is the first volume of Scottish Philosophy in the Eighteenth Century in the new series A History of Scottish Philosophy whose general editor is Gordon Graham. The volume is edited by Aaron Garrett and James A. Harris. Its chapters are generally excellent and authoritative.

Four chapters are devoted respectively to Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, Adam Smith, and Thomas Reid. They contain outstanding analyses by Daniel Carey ('Francis Hutcheson's Philosophy and the Scottish Enlightenment: Reception, Reputation, and Legacy'), Harris and Mikko Tolonen ('Hume in and out of Scottish Context'), Garrett and Ryan Hanley ('Adam Smith: History and Impartiality'), and Paul Wood ('Thomas Reid and the Common Sense School'). This attention to major figures is not to the detriment of lesser-known thinkers (such as Archibald Campbell and George Turnbull or, to mention a few members of the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, James Beattie, George Campbell, Alexander Gerard, and John Gregory).

Seven chapters deal with eighteenth-century Scotland's philosophical activities, disciplines, and networks set in their social, religious, political, and institutional contexts. Chapter 1, Roger Emerson's 'The World in Which the Scottish Enlightenment Took Shape, (reprinted from his Essays on David Hume, Medical Men, and the Scottish Enlightenment) sets the tone of a volume that gives much importance to historical contextualisation. Readers learn a lot especially about political and social philosophies ('Barbarism and Republicanism', by Silvia Sebastiani; 'Revolution', by Emma Macleod) and the relationships between philosophy and religion in a Scottish setting, a subject (exotic enough for non-Scots) Jeffrey M. Sunderland tackles in his chapter on 'Religion and Philosophy', but which surfaces in almost all sections. One major achievement is the combination of contextual and internal approaches. Contributors also add historiographical reflections on the history of Scottish philosophy. This is true not only of Wood's second contribution, a deep and dense postscript, 'On Writing the History of Scottish Philosophy in the Age of Enlightenment', but also of the majority of the chapters.

As a whole, the collection is less satisfactory. It is very difficult to see what the book’s overall structure is. The twelve chapters seem to present an arbitrary juxtaposition of themes insufficiently tempered by chronology. The limited focus of this first volume is difficult to accept. Its concentration on 'morals, politics, art, religion', leaving epistemology and the philosophy of mind aside ('half of the Scottish 'science of man', as the editors lucidly say (13), while they succumb to methodological akrasia), is not faithful to the unity of the Scottish philosophical programme. The philosophy of the history of philosophy that the editors sketch in the Introduction is not sufficiently argued and documented, and it does not seem to influence the other contributions. This is not necessarily a defect. Happily, the contents of the chapters often contradict the polemical (not to say antiphilosophical) tendency in the philosophy of the history of philosophy that the Introduction promises.

Garrett and Harris point out that a common explanation why philosophers, rather than non-philosophers, write the history of philosophy is the necessary dialogue between today's philosophy and philosophers of the past. They also claim that (a) such an explanation rests upon the presupposition of continuity in the conception, nay in the definition of philosophy. Now, according to them, (b) there is no such continuity for several reasons, including that while 'philosophy' used to stand for the totality of knowledge and sciences in the eighteenth century this is no longer the case. From (a) and (b) they infer that: (c) philosophers may not be the best at writing the history of philosophy, or, at least, what they write is a partial history, tailored to contemporary questions, one that should be complemented by a history written by non-philosophers.

The editors wonder why only philosophers should make a proper history of philosophy. They invoke the example of the history of physics, which is not written by physicists, and that of the history of economics. They do not mention the history of mathematics, which is mostly written by mathematicians for interesting reasons that have to do with the requisites for a correct understanding of the subject matter. They forget to mention that, in addition to the history of economics written mostly by non-economists, economists have found a niche: the 'history of economic thought'. Thus the claim that it is a 'peculiar feature of the history of philosophy that it is written primarily by philosophers' (2) should be qualified.

In passing, note that this kind of historiographical discussion is vulnerable to parochialism. The intellectual and professional situation of historians of philosophy significantly varies from one national tradition to another. In the French post-Gueroult tradition, history of philosophy has almost nothing to do with intellectual history as a contextual enterprise, and tends to consist in the monographic and systematic exploration of one philosopher after the other. The Italian model of the history of ideas counterbalances those excesses. What Garrett and Harris seem to have in mind is not the trite controversy about the importance of contexts for the understanding of philosophers (they clearly side with the contextualists) but rather the dominance of a scholastic map of questions and disciplinary divisions in the analytic approach to early modern philosophy. Instead of being happy with contemporary philosophers’ apparently growing openness to and mutual interest in the living repertoire of philosophies from the past, they tend to see it as a source of anachronism and historiographical biases. These may indeed be the results. For instance, Harris and Tolonen ('Hume In and Out of Scottish Context') have a point when they suggest that the label of moral sentimentalism, which corresponds to one of the available positions in the current debate in moral theory, when applied to Hume's stance, leads to oversimplification since it accounts for 'natural virtues' only, to the detriment of 'artificial virtues' (169). However, we should pay attention to the fact that contemporary Humeanism in moral philosophy also consists in reviving the artificialist dimension of Hume's reflection on 'convention'.

Let us get back to what Garrett and Harris think they can infer from both the continuity requirement (a) and the discontinuity thesis (b). I do not doubt that the normative conclusion that (c): philosophers should not monopolise the history of philosophy, is broadly correct, although I think that it should be derived from premises other than those the editors advance. For instance, the fact that during the early modern period the sciences of nature are called 'natural philosophy' is not a serious obstacle to understanding what early modern philosophers achieved. The claim (a) is doubtful in so far as our conversation with philosophers or the past, or the dialogue among contemporary philosophers, does not necessarily suppose that all subscribe to the same definition of philosophy.

Claim (b) is partly true. The map of 'philosophy' today is quite different from that of early modern philosophy. One major difference, which the editors signal without having drawn all the consequences of it for the structure and content of the volume, is about the meaning of 'moral philosophy' in eighteenth-century Scottish philosophy. The meaning was ambiguous and broad enough to include all enquiries about mental faculties and operations, human activities, and social phenomena. 'Moral philosophy' together with 'natural philosophy' constituted almost the whole of philosophy, with, perhaps, the more or less separate provinces of logic and metaphysics. Hume was more radical and imperialist than any other philosopher about the authority of 'moral philosophy', that is, of the philosophy of the mind, which in his view absorbed even logic and metaphysics. One claim about which most if not all Scottish philosophers agreed is that moral philosophy thus understood had to borrow its method from natural philosophy. In view of this, it is difficult not to consider as very euphemistic the editors' claim that 'philosophy and psychology . . . are hard to pull apart in an eighteenth-century context' (13). In fact, they are totally inseparable.

A proper construal of the Scots' understanding of 'moral philosophy' and related expressions (e.g., 'the science of man', 'the science of the human mind') is crucial to deciding whether eighteenth-century Scottish philosophers shared the same philosophical project. Although the editors correctly point out that 'of course 'moral philosophy' comprised more in the eighteenth century than it does now', they give a closed list that is not satisfactory: aesthetics, philosophy of religion, political philosophy, and ethics. The chair of moral philosophy at the University of Glasgow (held by Gershom Carmichael, Hutcheson, Smith, and Reid among others) although coexisting with a chair of logic and rhetoric and a chair in natural philosophy, had a broader scope. As to Hume, in the introduction to his Treatise of Human Nature, he assigned 'moral philosophy' (understood as 'the application of experimental philosophy to moral subjects') the dominant position that metaphysics previously had traditionally held. That said, the true first philosophy in the Aristotelian sense was what nineteenth-century philosophers would call 'psychology'. Note that Hume did not use 'pneumatology', a term employed by other Scottish philosophers, probably because it sounded too scholastic and metaphysical.

If the editors had placed more emphasis on the broad meaning of 'moral philosophy', they could have given the methodological programme of a Newtonian (in a quite loose sense) science of the human mind, in which most of these philosophers participated, a role in structuring the volume. Doing so would also have had the advantage of suggesting to readers aware of contemporary trends in epistemology and philosophy of mind how much current debates about naturalistic approaches to cognition echo controversies that were intrinsic to Scottish philosophy, especially the opposition of Thomas Reid to David Hume. There is an important legacy of the 'scepticism vs common sense' question. The tension between naturalism and providentialism in Scottish 'Newtonian' approaches to the philosophy of mind would also speak to contemporary philosophers. This would qualify the somewhat antiphilosophical flavour of the editors' introduction. We can still converse, without major misunderstandings, with eighteenth-century Scottish metaphilosophy.

Let us look more closely at Hume’s opening words in An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding: 'Moral philosophy, or the science of human nature'. Epistemology is obviously part of 'moral philosophy' thus understood. 'Moral' here means 'mental' rather than 'ethical'. The range is wider than Garrett and Colin Heydt ('Moral Philosophy: Practical and Speculative') recognise when they deal with the relationship between moral philosophy and the science of human nature (81-5). Christopher Berry's interpretation of the subtitle of Hume's Treatise, 'an attempt to introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects', does not withstand scrutiny: 'It is because 'moral' here derives etymologically from mores or social customs that we can reasonably label this an exercise in 'social science'.'' (284-5). Why not simply admit that here 'moral' does not have the sense it had in Locke's Essay, but signifies the 'mental' as opposed to the physical? Of course this does not prevent Hume from claiming that the moral is part and parcel of society and of nature as well.

The editors and some contributors raise the question whether Hume belongs to Scottish philosophy in the sense of the philosophy that Scottish institutions and individuals produced. The Introduction stresses Hume's singularity as a man of letters, whose horizons were not confined to Scottish or even British borders (7). This is true, but should not be taken as meaning that Scottish university professors like Smith and Reid did not have a strong European impact, although less immediate. It is also true that Hume, especially on religious matters, is aggressive enough to embody the spirit of the French rather than Scottish Enlightenment (the unavoidable question of Hume's philosophical atheism being nevertheless somewhat obscured, in the chapter devoted to Hume, by considerations about his affinities with the 'moderate party' in the Church of Scotland (186-191, see also 224-7)). However, if the volume had been structured by the idea, shared by most Scottish philosophers and notoriously by Hume, of a 'science of man' methodologically informed by the science of nature, this would have probably narrowed the gap between them, without denying major methodological disagreements in their understanding of the 'Newtonian' legacy. As Garrett and Heydt shrewdly notice: 'The commitment to a broadly Newtonian or Baconian method did not imply agreement about what the method constituted or what its contents were. It did usually, though, signal a commitment to explaining the diversity of moral phenomena by educing general rules or laws' (83). The way in which the editors insist on Hume's singularity, his Englishness rather than Scottishness, may sound exaggerated. In any case, it is not consistent with the chapters which, like the one Berry devotes to the human sciences, ascribe philosophical and methodological assumptions to 'the Scots' as an undifferentiated subject, which obviously includes Hume. Graham ('Beauty, Taste, Rhetoric, and Language') reminds us that Hume credited Hutcheson for having 'begun to put the science of man on a new footing' (138).

On the whole, the treatment of the question of the 'science of man' is scattered throughout chapters 3, 4, 5, 8, and 11, whereas its natural location should have been a general introduction on moral philosophy and the science of human nature. This would have been more in line with the way in which most Scottish philosophers thought of their own work, and thus with the editors' declared ambition. In particular, had the volume been more focused on the constitution of 'moral sciences', the lack of a chapter especially dedicated to political economy would have been more obvious. References to An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations are concentrated in a few pages of Garrett and Hanley's 'Adam Smith: History and Impartiality' and in Berry's 'The Rise of the Human Sciences'.

Moreover, if it is true that 'the Scottish Enlightenment' is not simply an historiographical label (on this, see Wood's illuminating comments, 457 ff.), but the programme of a 'Baconian and Newtonian' philosophy of the mind which Scottish philosophers, Hume included, shared and were well aware of, then the divide between this first volume -- on practical and normative philosophy -- and an upcoming second volume -- on knowledge, perception, and the mind -- may reflect the current state of philosophical disciplines in globalised academia rather than the eighteenth-century Scots' concept of philosophy, which is precisely what the editors wanted to avoid. Perhaps it would be better to accept the hermeneutic circle and write the history of philosophy from here and now. This would certainly give more philosophical weight to the debates about the place of the human mind in nature and would both highlight the originality of the Scottish Enlightenment and bridge the gap with today's philosophical questions. Fortunately, as I mentioned earlier, these shortcomings in the conception of the volume and the reflection on its methodology do not substantially affect the high quality of individual chapters, which may be approached in whatever order the reader prefers.