Second Philosophy: A Naturalistic Method

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Penelope Maddy, Second Philosophy: A Naturalistic Method, Oxford University Press, 2007, 368pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199273669.

Reviewed by Michael Liston, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


'Philosophical naturalism' is a blanket term for numerous vague stances that include a pro-attitude toward science.  Reflecting on modern philosophy's failed aspirations to provide extra-scientific justifications for our beliefs and methods, Quine urged us to cast aside those projects -- such justifications are neither possible nor necessary.  Instead, we should be naturalized epistemologists -- "busy sailors" on Neurath's boat, repairing its leaks when trouble arises, using and refashioning the tools on board while minimally disturbing the overall shape of the boat which has served us so well.  Penelope Maddy's new book has an ambitious aim: "to delineate and to practice a particularly austere form of naturalism" (1).  The delineation is effected by doing rather than saying.  Without a hard and fast science/non-science distinction, naturalism can't rely on mantras like "trust only the methods of science".  Maddy's Second Philosopher (henceforth SP) is an idealized inquirer, a busy sailor on Neurath's boat, who sails under the command of no sea-captain, whatever admiralty -- even the admiralty of Science -- appoints him.  Instead she becomes native to nautical know-how, developing for herself its principles as she goes.  "She simply begins from commonsense perception and proceeds from there to systematic observation, active experimentation, theory formation and testing, working all the while to assess, correct, and improve her methods as she goes" (2).  Though her project lies squarely in the Quinean tradition, Quine's naturalism is not sufficiently austere: many of his conclusions depend on an insufficiently examined framework of philosophical empiricism.

Maddy argues for and relies upon claims from and about science, two of which I introduce here for ease of exposition later.  (PSY) Studies in infant cognition indicate that pre-linguistic infants perceive and represent ordinary physical objects and, starting around the time language emerges, gradually develop sortal concepts and the apparatus of quantification.  (ATM) Historical investigation indicates that by 1860 atomic hypotheses enjoyed the Quinean theoretical virtues (simplicity, strength, conservatism, etc.) yet failed to be established until the early 1900s when Perrin experimentally detected the motion of atoms.

The book has four multi-chaptered parts.  In Part I, Maddy has SP engage with various philosophers to elucidate her characteristic approach.  SP tackles each proposal on its own merits.  The proposals fall into three groups.  Descartes and Stroud represent skeptical challenges.  Descartes, SP recognizes, had a point -- he invoked the method of universal doubt to undermine the Scholastic view of nature and open the way for Cartesian physics.  But she has no such motives: she finds Descartes' arguments for First Philosophy unconvincing.  She rejects Stroud's neo-Cartesian skeptical scenarios because they give her no extra motivation to attempt to justify her beliefs and methods ex nihilo, something she cannot do but hasn't been given any reason to attempt.  Kant, Carnap, and later-Putnam represent two-level views.  Each draws a science/philosophy distinction (for Kant, empirical/ transcendental inquiry; for Carnap, science/logic of science; for Putnam, ordinary/metaphysical realism).  Each agrees with the methods and findings provided by science -- and thus agrees with SP.  But each has another project that is supposed to be promoted by philosophy.  SP eventually rejects the point of this extra philosophical project.  Why shouldn't the empirical study of what conditions are a priori, what questions are well-formed, what objects are mind-independent be adequate without the need for some special, philosophical, extra-empirical account?  Hume and Quine represent naturalism manqué.  If Hume's scientific commonsense starting point leads to skepticism, then SP advocates that we question the starting point of his theory of ideas.  Of course Hume did not have the benefit of later developments in biology and psychology and thus had limited alternative starting points.  Quine, Maddy suggests, failed to practice what he preached.  Many of his doctrines depend on a framework (philosophical empiricism) that he uncritically inherited and that distinguishes experience from theoretical posits and sensory stimuli from the objects we posit to best organize experience.  But, Maddy argues, neither the framework nor the specific theses embedded in it withstand SP's critical scrutiny based on the best methods and information her scientific investigation provides.  (PSY) above shows that Quine is wrong to think of ordinary physical objects as organizational posits.  (ATM) shows that Quine is wrong to hold that we should believe theories that optimally possess the Quinean theoretical virtues.  Once the distinction between experience and theoretical posit is undermined, so too is confirmational holism, underdetermination, and even Quinean naturalism.

Part II shows SP at work on the nature of word-world relations.  The discussion covers Field's arguments for correspondence, Leeds's disquotationalism, Wright's minimalism, and Wilson's correlational approach.  What did Tarski define when he defined truth using primitive reference clauses?  Correspondence theorists argue that he defined a causal word-world relation that's needed to underwrite success explanations.  I hear, 'There are rabbits in yonder field'; I need food for my larder; so I go and trap some rabbits.  My success in getting food seems to depend on a correspondence between the sentence I heard and the local rabbits.  Disquotationalists reply that there's no more to truth and reference than what Tarski defined.  The utility of truth talk lies elsewhere: 'true' is a useful expressive device, enabling us to express claims we couldn't otherwise express.  Success explanations can be handled without truth or reference -- I got rabbits for my larder because there were rabbits in yonder field (no mention of truth or correspondence).  Maddy argues tentatively that SP should adopt a modified disquotationalism.  Genuine explanatory notions like chemical valence are unlike reference: the concept of valence was a non-trivial empirical achievement that might not have turned out to be undergirded by atomic theory; the definition of the reference clauses needed for truth amounts to a trivial list that only philosophical prejudices about physicalism could persuade us to see as a causal relation.  The modification to disquotationalism consists in arguing that word-world relations (or belief-world relations) are, nevertheless, subjects fit for naturalistic investigation.  Some of an ancient's 'Zeus'-beliefs may be reliable indicators of something or other (though not their truth conditions) that help him perform certain tasks successfully (like going inside when he hears thunder).  But the study of these indication relations is likely to be far more complicated than what truth and reference can capture.  Maddy proposes that their investigation be conducted using the richer and more delicate tool-kit (of supports, directivities, facades, etc.) that Wilson's correlational approach develops.

Part III takes up SP's reflections on logical truth, our knowledge of it, and logical necessity.  Kant's view of logic combined two distinct attractive features: empirically, logic describes the underlying structure of the world; transcendentally, logic is embodied in our most primitive forms of conceptualization.  SP seeks a unified account that preserves both features without transcendental apparatus.  Maddy characterizes an abstract Kant-Frege structure (a KF-world) of objects, properties, and relations.  Unlike standard first order structures, KF-worlds contain ground-consequent dependencies and indeterminacies.  A rudimentary logic, RL, emerges.  Maddy makes three claims: (1) RL is true of the macroworld.  We have good commonsense and scientific reasons to believe that ordinary physical objects, their properties and relations, and their objective vagueness and dependencies exemplify a KF-structure.  (2) Human beings believe the simple truths of RL because their primitive cognitive mechanisms enable them to detect and represent the KF-structure of the world.  In support of this Maddy draws on a substantial body of experimental studies on infant cognition conducted in the 1990s.  (PSY) shows, she argues, that humans can detect and represent some of the world's KF-structures before language emerges and without training or extensive sensory-motor experience.  Thus the very structure of our cognition strongly inclines us to believe that the simplest RL inferences must hold.  (3) Human cognitive structures are RL-configured because the macro-world is a KF-world.  Here the scientific evidence is less conclusive: animal studies suggest that our RL abilities are not tied to language; but it's an open question whether we have them because of evolutionary inheritance or early perceptual experiences.  Thus, there is a contingency to RL -- the sound operation of its rules depends on their being used in a KF-situation -- yet we tend to ignore this contingency and feel they must deliver validity, because KF-structuring is built into our cognition.  Finally, Maddy argues that, because RL is weak and unwieldy (it has gaps), we idealize away its gap-making features to obtain standard classical, first-order structures.  Classical logic applies directly only to these idealized structures -- not to the world -- but in the many contexts where classical structures are good approximations of KF-structures, classical logic is a trustworthy instrument, justified by the strength and tractability it provides.

Part IV explores issues primarily in philosophy of mathematics but also in philosophy of science, metaphysics.  Maddy examines and rejects several arguments for mathematical realism.  She rejects arguments from indispensability and confirmational holism on grounds that this is not how science works.  Scientists use whatever mathematics is available and convenient without considering whether their experiments confirm mathematics or whether mathematics has a realist interpretation.  She rejects arguments from the amazing effectiveness of mathematics on grounds that the amazing effectiveness is more apparent than real and can be otherwise explained.  Much of mathematics was developed with related applications in mind.  Where there are coincidences, we tend to forget all the failures and the trial-and-error process leading to the few successes, and we underestimate the likelihood that the vast warehouse of mathematics contains a solution to a problem.  Mathematics in application, Maddy concludes, has nothing to tell us about mathematical truth or ontology.  An examination of mathematical practice shows that the methodological questions of mathematics are settled by reference to goals internal to the practice, not by theories about the nature and truth of mathematics.  Nevertheless mathematics is a highly constrained activity unique in having useful applications.  It looks like science.  So SP still needs to understand that practice and to investigate whether mathematics is truth-apt.  Maddy compares and contrasts three accounts.  Robust Realism (the objects of mathematics exist, its statements are true or false independent of our thought) is rejected because it cannot connect mathematical methods with the mathematical reality it posits.  Thin Realism claims that sets exist and set theory truly describes them: sets are just what set theory, the product of those methods that best serve the aims of set theory, tells us they are.  Arealism claims that mathematical objects don't exist and pure mathematics doesn't discover truths; it's a practice with its own internal questions, norms, and goals.  Arealism can account for successful applications by claiming that when we mathematize a physical problem we treat its physical content as if it were the mathematical representation.  Provided the two are sufficiently similar, we can use the mathematics to draw conclusions about the physics.  Nothing extra is added by making truth and existence claims for the mathematical representation.  Maddy argues that nothing hinges on the choice of a Thin Realist or Arealist account.

I close with some reservations and general comments.  I'm not persuaded that Thin Realism/Arealism can provide adequate accounts of mathematical applications.  Our confidence that satellite launches will end in desired orbits depends on the soundness of our calculations.  To establish the soundness of the mathematical instrument requires elaborate detours into background mathematics.  It's not enough to say that if the physics of the problem and its mathematical representation are sufficiently similar, we can use the mathematics to reason to our conclusions.  We want to know that they are sufficiently similar.  We want to know (a) the conditions required for the sound operation of the mathematical model and (b) that the particular engineering problem falls within that set of conditions.  The former requires a mathematical proof that a range of mathematically modeled physical conditions will reliably lead via the mathematical representation to a solution that lies within that range.[1]  Robust Realism will not help: why should beliefs about a free-floating mathematical realm give us moral certainty of the practical success of our calculations?  But it's also not clear how the accounts Maddy favors (where correctness is a function of furthering internal goals of pure mathematics) will work.

(PSY) and (ATM) are controversial.  True, Perrin's experiments marked the turning point that properly swayed opinion in favor of the existence of atoms.  But the claim that atomism enjoyed the Quinean theoretical virtues before 1900 is questionable.  Both proponents and opponents of atoms agreed that synthetic treatments contradicted each other and showed little promise of unification while the best analytical and statistical treatments were too indirect and seriously underdetermined atomic hypotheses.  One reason why Perrin's work was decisive was its removal of this underdetermination.  Anti-atomists believed (wrongly) that energetics offered more promise of a consistent, unified account of physics.  For different reasons, we should be cautious about (PSY): the experiments, though carefully designed and controlled, are very recent, and psychology's theoretical presuppositions are not stable.  Maddy recognizes this: she concedes that SP may have to rethink logical representation if connectionist opponents of structured representations provide a distinct, experimentally confirmed option (302).

These reservations are minor and do not affect the general approach.  SP is an idealized inquirer, Maddy is a concrete embodiment of SP.  As Maddy points out, "one might sign on as a Second Philosopher while thinking I've gone astray in my pursuit of the particulars" (3).  This reviewer is happy to enlist but has a couple of residual worries.  Maddy is rightly suspicious of general norms and approaches.  We should begin, not from general principles, but from individual case studies that may get us to general principles (403).  Nevertheless, our native urge for answers to big questions like those Maddy tackles is difficult to deny.  Even if we restrict our attention to scientific versions of the questions, their generality will require us to extrapolate from individual cases, and it's difficult to see how to extrapolate without some tentative general principles and frameworks.  At any stage of inquiry we have limited options available, and we can't be sure that the available options aren't infected by philosophical prejudices.  In the absence of good alternatives, Hume can't be blamed for his holding the theory of ideas.  Perhaps Quine failed because he uncritically hitched his wagon to philosophical empiricism; perhaps he simply saw it as the best naturalistic route to take.  Admittedly this is just the fallibilist predicament of any scientist.  But given the difficulties, this SP is inclined to be less imperialistic in ambition than Maddy's SP is sometimes portrayed.

The book is excellent: the thesis is refreshing, the presentation clear and forthright, the argumentation careful, the research thorough and informed.  It contains a wealth of material that should appeal to far more readers than those of us who are already susceptible to second philosophy.  It presents the best exploration and defense of naturalism I know of.  A primary lesson is that we ought not to build philosophical theories on anything as shaky as intuitions that things must be thus-and-so.  Too often our intuitions -- whether inherited from our academic training, the workings of our language, or our natural make-up -- are no more than virtually irresistible impulses to think in certain ways.  Liberal doses of concrete case studies are probably our best strategy of resistance.

[1] Wilson, Mark (2006) Wandering Significance (Oxford: Oxford University Press).