Second Thoughts and the Epistemological Enterprise

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Hilary Kornblith, Second Thoughts and the Epistemological Enterprise, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 266pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108498517.

Reviewed by Jennifer Nagel, University of Toronto


"Don't overthink this." That common bit of advice is often sound, but not so often championed by philosophers, fond of rumination as we are. Among philosophers -- and here I hope I am not generalizing too swiftly from my own experience -- epistemologists are surely the worst in getting trapped by the spell of reflection, even when it takes us to awkwardly self-referential and paralyzing extremes. If, like me, you've ever had a moment of wanting a well-trained professional to throw some cold water on that attraction, you will find much to enjoy in Hilary Kornblith's new collection of essays. The book brings together ten chapters and articles spanning the years 1989-2017, with two newly written pieces. Many issues are engaged -- peer disagreement, naturalism, a priori knowledge -- but the mission that unifies this collection is its campaign to take reflective thinking down from the various pedestals that epistemologists have constructed for it. Against a series of adversaries who see reflection as the ultimate fount of epistemic value, Kornblith advocates closer attention to its faults, coupled with greater appreciation of the charms of unreflective thought.

The first chapter, "Introspection and Misdirection", starts by observing that while the hope of epistemic self-improvement is one factor that might lure anyone towards epistemology, internalists greatly outshine externalists in promising help on this frontier. This disparity was doubtless larger three decades ago when this piece was written, but it lingers even now. Indeed, Kornblith is exceptional among externalist epistemologists in his sustained focus on prescriptive projects. Somehow, something about the internalist focus on the first-person perspective seems to lend itself very naturally to giving directions, in contrast to the relative detachment of the externalist's third-person angle. What Kornblith finds, looking back through the history of internalism, is a common faith in the epistemic benefits of individual self-examination as a guiding force. This faith takes different shapes in the exemplary internalists Kornblith discusses here: he uncovers notable differences between Descartes, Roderick Chisholm, and Laurence BonJour. Internalists disagree about whether the benefits of looking within ourselves will come chiefly from seeing why we believe what we do, whether it meets our own epistemic standards, or how well it coheres with the rest of what we believe. Whatever payoff is promised, however, Kornblith is concerned that self-examination will not deliver. His worry is not just that self-examination is less perfect than internalists have taken it to be, but something sharper: "Those who are most in need of epistemic improvement will be harmed most by seeking aid from introspection." (17) In his view, agents who are already on the right track epistemically have little to gain from turning inwards, and those who are self-deceived and internally incoherent are likely to make things worse.

Kornblith draws support for this worry, both in this piece and throughout the collection, from anti-introspective research in social psychology. He is moved by Richard Nisbett and Timothy Wilson's investigations of our access to our reasons for choice, for example, dwelling on their celebrated study of shoppers who were asked which of four pairs of nylon stockings they preferred, where the stockings in question were in fact identical.[1] Although the shoppers were more than three times as likely to pick the rightmost (and last examined) stockings over those at the far left, apparently none of them cited position as a reason for their choice, and almost all reportedly denied the relevance of position when asked. Indeed, even before being prompted for reasons, most spontaneously volunteered some feature of the look or texture of the confidently chosen pair as their basis for choice. Kornblith reads this study as indicating that shoppers whose unreflective judgment was nonsensically guided by right-side position reflectively confabulated other reasons for it, to generate the appearance of justification, with no awareness that they were doing so. Far from clarifying their epistemic position, introspection obscured it, and made it seem better than it was. One might worry about the empirical details of this study,[2] or protest that this is a strangely contrived situation in which self-understanding will naturally be overtaxed.[3] But even if the deliverances of reflection are not ordinarily so worthless, Kornblith argues that cases like this speak against casting reflection in the special role that many internalists have wanted to see it play. In his view, the problem is not just that we lack Cartesian insight into the true origins of our judgments, but that introspective examination is generally an interpretive exercise which begins from an assumption of one's rationality, so that in cases where a choice is less than rational, introspection is ill-suited to uncover this fact.

Kornblith's empirically-motivated objections to the epistemic status of introspection continue through the core of the book, deepening into a larger series of challenges to prominent ways of handling the first-person perspective in epistemology. Chapter 5, "What Reflective Endorsement Cannot Do", tackles the importance assigned to reflective endorsement by philosophers who see reflection as a capacity that not only sets humanity apart from other animals, but also serves as the source of a distinctive type of epistemic state or value. In Ernest Sosa's reliabilism, for example, reflective knowledge is distinguished from, and set above, unreflective (or animal) knowledge. The higher state of reflective knowledge is supposed to situate ordinary first-order judgments in a larger context of self-understanding, where this reflective activity is credited with producing judgments that are better integrated and more reliably true. Kornblith wonders whether the addition of a special epistemic state is well-motivated here: reflection might be a uniquely human manner of attaining knowledge, but it is not obvious that what it yields is a different type of knowledge. He also resists the suggestion of higher reliability for reflective cognition as such: in his view, we have empirical evidence that some reflective mechanisms "sometimes act as sub-personal cognitive yes-men," increasing confidence in our first-order beliefs without changing their reliability, while others may either improve or worsen things. In his view, "reflecting on one's beliefs is a mixed bag: sometimes better, sometimes worse, and sometimes just the same as belief uninfluenced by subsequent reflection" (97). Against internalists who believe in "second-order magic", Kornblith holds that "second-order mental states are not so different from first-order mental states" (112).

This careful neutrality between reflective and unreflective cognition sometimes slides into hostility towards reflection, for example in chapter 7, where Kornblith argues that "the first-person perspective presents a partial and distorted view of the bases of our beliefs" (141). According to Kornblith,

When we introspect and ask ourselves why it is that we hold some belief, we unknowingly engage in a process of confabulation, frequently attributing various beliefs to ourselves, beliefs which we take to have been instrumental in producing the very belief we are questioning, but which we did not hold prior to the exercise of self-examination. (143-44)

He concludes that "reflective self-examination of the sort offered by a first-person perspective on our beliefs fails utterly to do the job of locating the errors which we unreflectively make." (144)

This chapter pushes the case against reflection into deeper waters. One might wonder whether introspection was misleading in the stockings experiment in part because subjects were challenged to give an explicit articulation of what was in fact an unreflective choice; perhaps introspection would be better positioned to guide us epistemically in cases where the original judgment or decision was made by consciously rehearsing relevant considerations in deliberation. Kornblith is pessimistic about first-person insight here as well. He considers the case of a doctor who has amassed considerable evidence on a complex case, and upon finding the diagnosis difficult, self-consciously reasons about what she ought to believe (148). Kornblith is concerned that the doctor's reasoning will present itself to her in a manner that will seem transparent, even while many crucial aspects of her cognition are unconscious, from biases influencing the weighting of evidence to unconscious processes restricting the range of hypotheses consciously considered. According to Kornblith, in moments of stopping to reflect, we aim to be more accurate, but such aims are "frequently frustrated" in a manner that will not be apparent to the subject, and these moments of reflecting are "frequently epiphenomenal with respect to belief fixation" (151).

The reader will naturally wonder what "frequently" means here, and in similar passages throughout the work. Even a 1% failure rate arguably presents a problem for a hypothetical internalist whose reliance on reflection is premised on its being a perfectly transparent source of self-insight and epistemic improvement, but a less extreme opponent might want to see evidence of much worse performance before losing faith, or concluding that reflection "fails utterly" and is no more likely than not to improve our epistemic standing. Kornblith generally allows that reflection is sometimes helpful, and sometimes not, but the reader may end up wanting more substantive discussion of the circumstances under which it ends up on one side or the other. While devoting considerable attention to empirical work on biases, he does not cover empirical work on the great range of conditions under which self-consciousness increases accuracy.[4] Even if there are many aspects of cognition that remain offstage as we introspect, we are still capable of remembering much of what figured in explicit deliberation, which is hardly epiphenomenal to judgment. If in real life, the doctor who thinks twice about her diagnosis has no reasonable prospect of catching her unreflective errors by doing so, then it becomes something of a mystery why this effortful capacity for second thoughts is typically exercised. To try to solve that mystery, it has been argued that reflective cognition is naturally triggered by the subjective experience of disfluency, where this disfluency serves as a natural marker that unreflective cognition is compromised in its accuracy.[5] More recent explanations of reflection have focused on the epistemic gains available from the active control of attention.[6] This work explores the sense of self generated by epistemic action, in a way that could shed light on the original problem of why the prescriptive stance seemed closely bound to the first-person perspective. Meanwhile, other research examines the limits of what unreflective cognition can handle: certain novel and complex problems seem to demand reflective handling, for reasons that an epistemologist could profitably explore.

I am tempted to register as a complaint against Kornblith that deeper engagement with the empirical literature on metacognition could have supported a better assessment of the epistemic value of reflection; I am also tempted to protest that he spends too much time fighting against old-school infallibilist internalists, rather than contemporary moderate internalists. On reflection, I recognize that there is something wrong with both of these temptations. To press the first point would be to grant Kornblith's larger objective: his ultimate goal is to give introspection exactly the epistemic place that its empirical track record supports, and it is no impediment to that ultimate goal if the empirical track record is a bit rosier than Nisbett and Wilson imagined. On the second point, whenever I was struck by the sense that internalists have moved on from the positions Kornblith is criticizing, I had to double-check the original dates of publication, and remember that Kornblith himself gets significant credit for having moved them along.

Coming up to the present day, the two new essays at the end of the collection are especially satisfying. In what seems at first to be a departure from his usual concerns, Kornblith tackles David Velleman's controversial arguments about the importance of family history in shaping an individual's self-conception. Where Velleman contends that a vital part of our sense of self arises from the stories we tell ourselves about our biological families, Kornblith points out that our sense of self arises from many sources, and cautions that family lore is often inaccurate, and sometimes suffocating or draining. Kornblith grants that there can be some satisfaction in generating a narrative explanation of one's place in the world, but he resists the suggestion that the self-imposition of meaningful order is what gives such narratives value. False stories create "a fool's paradise, or, worse still, a hell of one's own making" (237). In Kornblith's view, the best narratives about the self are true stories, where truths about biological parentage pale in significance next to truths about our larger human inheritance, and about the causal reality of our individual lives. In the end, this piece summed up the spirit of the collection: even when the topic is yourself, look outward at your place in the world to avoid becoming entangled in a bad self-conception.

[1] Nisbett, Richard E., and Timothy D. Wilson. "Telling more than we can know: verbal reports on mental processes." Psychological Review 84, no. 3 (1977): 231-259.

[2] It is not obvious that we actually do have a positional bias: in choices between identical items, a tendency to select the rightmost item is not always observed (e.g., Christenfeld, Nicholas. "Choices from identical options." Psychological Science 6, no. 1 (1995): 50-55). Early on, Nisbett and Wilson themselves suggested that the bias was "in fact a temporal order effect rather than a spatial position effect," with the last-examined and therefore best-remembered item presenting least ambiguity at the moment of choice (Wilson, Timothy, and Richard E. Nisbett. "The accuracy of verbal reports about the effects of stimuli on evaluations and behavior." Social Psychology (1978): 118-131, p. 124). If this is right, the reported sense of slightly superior texture in the last-examined pair might be an honest report of subject's frame of mind at the moment of choice, rather than a lapse into irrational confabulation. On this model, failure to recognize the stockings as identical arises as a natural function of memory limitations, but at the moment of choice the imperfectly remembered stockings do seem different in a way that does guide choice. Kornblith could still observe that our imperfect awareness of memory decay entails imperfect insight into our own decision-making processes, but if choices of this type are ecologically rare, one might not be deeply troubled by these imperfections.

[3]Arguing against the theory that introspection generally produces problematic rationalization, one recent critic goes so far as to say, "It could be viewed as rational to give and defend an implausible answer if a psychologist asks you an impossible question such as which pair of identical stockings you prefer." Stafford, Tom. "Evidence for the rationalisation phenomenon is exaggerated." Behavioral and Brain Sciences (in press).

[4] E.g., Lerner, Jennifer S., and Philip E. Tetlock. "Accounting for the effects of accountability." Psychological Bulletin 125.2 (1999): 255-275.

[5] Oppenheimer, Daniel M. "The secret life of fluency." Trends in Cognitive Sciences 12.6 (2008): 237-241.

[6] E.g., Metzinger, Thomas (2017). "The Problem of Mental Action -- Predictive Control without Sensory Sheets." In T. Metzinger & W. Wiese (Eds.). Philosophy and Predictive Processing. Frankfurt am Main: MIND Group.