Secularism and Freedom of Conscience

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Jocelyn Maclure and Charles Taylor, Secularism and Freedom of Conscience, Jane Marie Todd (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2011, 142pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674058651.

Reviewed by Ruth Abbey, University of Notre Dame


Readers hoping for a condensed version of Taylor's 2007 tome, A Secular Age, will not find it here. Instead, this short book is the translation of a French work Taylor recently co-authored with Maclure entitled Laïcité et liberté de conscience (Montreal: Boréal). Jane Marie Todd is the translator. As the acknowledgements at the book's end explain (135, cf. 120-21 n.16), this work elaborates on some of the issues explored in Taylor's 2008 report (co-authored with Gerard Bouchard) for the Consultation Commission on Accommodation Practices Related to Cultural Differences in the province of Quebec.[1] Maclure, a professor of Philosophy at Laval University, was one of the expert advisors to that commission.

As its title signals, the Quebec commission was charged with examining the accommodation of minority cultures within the province. Religious differences feature prominently among the bases upon which citizens seek exemption from or special consideration regarding general rules, norms, and regulations in public institutions like schools, universities, hospitals, and workplaces (63). For that reason, Chapter 7 of the commission's report -- "The Quebec system of secularism" -- reflects on the state's relationship to religious diversity, but this issue also surfaces in several places throughout the report as a whole. In Secularism and Freedom of Conscience,Taylor and Maclure describe themselves as expanding and revising the views contained in that chapter (136).[2] Although the book grows out of their Quebec experience, and Chapter Six is dedicated to the case of Quebec, the authors repeatedly observe that many liberal democratic polities are grappling with these issues (42, 109). Citing examples from France, England, Turkey, Canada, and the US lends wider relevance to their discussion.

Taylor and Maclure aim to provide "an adequate conceptual analysis of the constitutive principles of secularism" (3, cf. 41), contending that any understanding of secularism must "be approached within the broader problematic of the state's necessary neutrality toward the multiple values, beliefs, and life plans of citizens in modern societies" (11, cf. 13, 19). As their point of departure, they accept Rawls's depiction of the conditions of modern pluralism, including such ideas as the burdens of judgment and the need for an overlapping consensus on the principles of political co-operation (10-12, 15-18, 20-21, 107-8). Secularism's two major aims are respect for the moral equality of persons and protection of freedom of conscience and religion (4, 20, 22). Its two operative modes are the separation of church and state and state neutrality toward religious beliefs and other matters of conscience (20, 22-3). These operative modes should not become ends in themselves but must remain as means in the service of the twin principles of respect for the equality of persons and liberty of conscience (28-9).

Notwithstanding the clarity and economy of this approach, Taylor and Maclure insist that their concept of secularism is pluralist: its twin principles can come into tension with one another just as its operative modes can be realized in different ways (23-4). Their phrase "regimes of secularism" (26-35) is designed to capture this fact that secularism can be practiced in different ways. Of the various ways in which secularism can be realized, Taylor and Maclure specify two: some forms are flexible and open while others are more rigid and strict. Republican forms of secularism are typically more rigid and strict while liberal-pluralist forms are more flexible and open (27, 34). But openness versus rigidity can also characterize particular policies as well as regimes in toto, for a relatively open regime might nonetheless adopt a strict policy on an issue such as veiling, for example (28). The original report to the Quebec commission endorsed the idea of open secularism [la laïcité ouverte] as more suited to Quebec but here, as the choice of adjectives suggests, open forms of secularism have become the preferred model for all liberal democracies.

Chapter 3, on regimes of secularism, also points out that any anti-religious agenda on the state's part violates its principled commitment to neutrality, and so fails to respect the equality of citizens (29-32, cf. 14-15). Taylor and Maclure charge the republican model with this error, at least in its attempt to banish expressions of religious faith from the public realm (34, 36, 39). Along with infringing the ideal of state neutrality, this regime of secularism fails to distinguish political from social secularization (15-16). While the former process tries, appropriately in the authors' view, to distance the state from any particular religion or worldview, the latter is a sociological process by which religion becomes less influential in society. A secular state should remain neutral toward social secularization, making no active attempt to hasten it.

But it is not enough for the state to be as neutral as possible between its citizens' choices and values: it must also be seen to be neutral. Chapter 5 examines whether public officials wearing religious insignia in the workplace transgresses state neutrality. Taylor and Maclure conclude that insofar as such insignia do not interfere with the effective conduct of an official's job, they should be permitted. What matters is the employee's conduct, not his or her appearance (44-5). Wearing a burqa, however, is probably incompatible with effective conduct in a position where non-verbal communication matters (46). In this context the authors discuss the legitimacy of religious symbols in public spaces and the embedding of religious holidays in a society's public calendar. They conclude that in many cases, these symbols and practices testify to the society's religious heritage rather than having any contemporary expressive or proselytizing function. As such they are unobjectionable (50-52, 67-8). The Christmas tree has, for example, become so eviscerated of religious significance that it should not, in their estimation, be interpreted as an affront to religious pluralism (117, n. 6).

The major question wrestled with in Part II is how to distinguish matters of conscience, religious or otherwise, from mere personal preference. If the state is to grant special accommodation out of respect for moral equality and liberty of conscience, it is important to be able to verify genuine appeals to matters of conscience or conviction (13, 77, 91). As well as considering some of the legal challenges this poses, this discussion carries echoes of Taylor's long-standing notion of strong evaluation.

This short work offers a clear and accessible account of some of the central issues at stake in theoretical and practical debates about the relationship between religion and politics in contemporary western societies. One question I was left with at the end, however, was who its intended audience is. Because A Secular Age had little to say explicitly about political philosophy, this work might satisfy some residual curiosity about Taylor's views on straightforwardly political questions that fall within its orbit. Secularism and Freedom of Conscience traverses a lot of ground in very short space, which prevents it from going into great detail on any single topic. Its engagement with the vast scholarly literature on the topics it touches on is light, suggesting that its primary audience is newcomers to this topic, and perhaps the elusive general reader, rather than academic researchers in this field.

[1] The report's English version is Building the Future: A Time for Reconciliation. For a discussion of the report, see Ruth Abbey, 'Plus ça Change: Charles Taylor on Accommodating Quebec's Minority Cultures', Thesis Eleven, November 2009, Issue 99, pp. 71-92.

[2] As no division of labor between the authors is indicated, I impute the book's ideas to both.