Secularism, Identity, and Enchantment

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Akeel Bilgrami, Secularism, Identity, and Enchantment, Harvard University Press, 2014, 397pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674052048.

Reviewed by Nikolas Kompridis, Institute for Social Justice, Australian Catholic University


Occasionally, albeit, much too occasionally, philosophers illuminate the great challenges of the age, conceptually and critically, opening up genuinely new pathways for thinking about and responding to these challenges. In his latest book Akeel Bilgrami does this superbly, brilliantly, and very carefully. Carefully, in the sense of taking great care to get things right, and treating those things as themselves worthy objects of care and concern (and not simply as instrumental to the purposes of his arguments). Bilgrami describes his book undramatically as speaking to the issues of

the relation between religion and politics . . . governed by a philosopher's interest in . . . practical reason; and in particular, to broaden that interest by studying the extent to which practical reason is or is not efficacious in navigating the prima facie conflicts that secularism is confronted with. (x)

I find this description excessively, if commendably, sober, for the book, and the larger project which it announces, is much richer and much broader in scope than is reflected in this statement of its purpose, and, much more radical, both philosophically and politically. One would expect nothing less from a book dedicated to Noam Chomsky and Prabhat Patnaik. Having read it a couple of times -- it takes at least a couple of readings to appreciate just how much more is at stake, especially in its four longest chapters -- I do not think its primary contribution is to our understanding of practical reason, whether to its limits or to its efficacy. At least not to practical reason as it is conventionally understood in the discipline.

Bilgrami's much more fundamental contribution is better (but not fully) captured in a passage describing the highly integrated nature of Gandhi's philosophizing, in which is manifested "the sustained integration of political, moral, and epistemological themes" (118). According to Bilgrami, the only other philosopher who came close to such a sustained integration of these normally sequestered themes was Heidegger. Regardless of what some may think of this comparison, anyone who reads Bilgrami's book attentively will see that the sustained integration of political, moral, and epistemological themes is also and precisely the goal that drives his thinking. The fact that there are more than a dozen places in which he employs the language of integration at crucial points in the argument tellingly demonstrates how systematic and principled, methodologically and normatively, is the integrating style of thought exemplified in it. But there is yet more to it. Bilgrami works at integrating phenomena that ought to be integrated with one another, through which integration new possibilities for thought and action are disclosed, and, conversely, at dis-integrating deeply and often invisibly integrated phenomena, through whose integration alternative possibilities for thought and action are foreclosed. We can see here the Janus-faced nature of this integrating style of thought: one side shows its normative orientation, the other its genealogical orientation.

Both sides are exemplarily instanced in the four massive chapters that constitute the book's core. I say massive not just because each one is roughly 50 pages, but also because of the density and complexity of their argument. If the book were represented architecturally in two-dimensional space, its argument structure would comprise four key pillars, two at the center, represented by the essays "Gandhi (and Marx)" and "The Political Possibilities of the Long Romantic Period," and one at either end, represented by "Secularism: Its Content and Context" (on the far left) and "Occidentalism, the Very Idea" (on the far right). At the cost of setting aside discussion of the other fascinating chapters I will focus on just these four, each of which is truly a tour de force.

The essay on Gandhi and Marx begins with an intriguing exploration of their affinities, made possible by their common concern with the problem of alienation arising from and specific to conditions of capitalist modernity. Bilgrami persuasively demonstrates how both Gandhi and Marx are

diagnosing the same thing: the transformation of the human subject to an object or, to put it more elaborately, an increasing detachment of the wrong kind in one's relation to the world, including one's relations to others and, therefore, an increasing loss of genuine subjectivity and subjective engagement with the world and with others" (130).

But as one comes to expect from Bilgrami by this point, this chapter has far-reaching ambitions, which include, first of all, a conceptual and normative reformulation of the concepts of equality and liberty, carried out from the normative perspective of an unalienated life. Inspired by both Gandhi and Marx, Bilgrami refuses to accept the traditional liberal framework in which these two central concepts are in tension with, and, at times, in antagonistic relation to, one another. What is required, he argues, is a change of framework. "In such a new framework neither 'liberty' nor 'equality' would mean what they mean in the framework of Enlightenment thought, no more than 'mass' in Einstein's physics meant what it meant in Newtownian mechanics." (128).

Of course, we cannot see what liberty and equality could otherwise mean, without seeing the outline of such a new framework. That framework starts to come into view through a slow, patient, and methodical development of the implications of Gandhi's (and Marx's) critique of the modern sources of alienation. For Bilgrami, Gandhi's critique is an attempt to answer the most fundamental question of human self-alienation: "How and when did we begin to think of the world as not merely a place to live in but a place to master and control." Bilgrami conceptually differentiates this more general question into a series of quite specific questions:

1) how and when did we transform the concept of nature into the concept of natural resources? 2) How and when did we transform the concept of human beings into the concept of citizens? 3) How and when did we transform the concept of people into the concept of populations? 4) How and when did we transform the concept of knowledges to live by into the concept of expertise to rule by? (133)

Through a genealogical account that begins in 17th century Europe, Bilgrami is able to show how and why Gandhi came to regard "these four transformations as being, at bottom, the same transformation" (150). All four were manifestations of "a single alienating process," beginning in

a desacralization and . . . consequent adoption of an objectifying attitude of detachment toward both nature and its inhabitants . . . owed to outlooks developing around the rise of modern science and which -- through worldly alliances formed between scientific ideologues, commercial interests and established . . . religious institutions -- gave rise to a form of political economy and of political governance that . . . were destructively exploitative of nature and its inhabitants, and that were elitist and undemocratic in the apparatus of rule that they set up. (150)

Deepening his normative and genealogical analysis, Bilgrami takes a closer look at what it means for a life to be unalienated, and what conditions must be met for such an unalienated life to be livable. This line of inquiry leads to questions of agency and value, and to an argument that links the possibility of an engaged and unalienated form of agency to the possibility of experiencing the human and non-human world as a source of value. Arguing against Humean and like-minded views of value as the projection of subjective desires and preferences, Bilgrami makes the strong quasi-transcendental claim that "we cannot even make sense of the idea that we are capable of practical agency, unless we see practical agency as something responsive to value properties in the world" (158). If value properties were only extensions of our desires and preferences, he argues,

then we necessarily experience them as alienated because they would always be given to us in the third person perspective on ourselves. . . . But . . . if my desiring something is given to me indirectly via my experience of the desirability (the value properties) of something . . . I would then be in the first person mode, taking in the world around me and by the perception of its desirabilities and value properties, which make normative demands on me, prompted to act on the world. (159)

By thinking of agency relationally, in this sense, as necessarily requiring attunement to sources of value outside us, our picture of agency and value changes in concert with a change in orientation to nature and the non-human as such. We have never been in a better position than now, as we are living in and coming to grips with the unprecedented challenges of the era of the Anthropocene, to see how a desacralized nature stripped of all normative status combined with a subjectivistic view of agency and value has led to potentially catastrophic and irreversible circumstances for human and non-human nature: "since nothing intrinsic in nature is valuable, nothing in nature can constrain our desires, utilities, and moral sentiments" (155). There is, in other words, nothing to listen to "out there," and therefore nothing "out there" for which we are accountable other than the desires and preferences we ourselves project "out there."

But does our only hope for overcoming our self-alienation and our destructiveness require a resacralization of nature and the world? Siding more with Marx than with Gandhi, Bilgrami argues that a resacralization of nature is not a necessary condition of overcoming our alienation from it, for we have "a more secular conceptual repertoire" (156) on which to draw to think about what it would mean to re-enchant the world. We do not need, thinks Bilgrami, to resacralize the world to better attune ourselves to its value properties, or to respond to those properties as normative demands. Perceiving and responding to the world's value properties is all the enchantment we require to give back to the world the power to resist and "constrain our desires, utilities, and moral sentiments," and to open up the normative and ontological space for an unalienated relation to ourselves and to non-human life (155). This would also help us "find a way to directly hear the normative demands coming from nature on institutions of political representations," such that these institutions "give political voice to the demands coming from nature itself" (163). That is now an urgent task, and the time during which it could be simply, thoughtlessly, dismissed as a silly romantic yearning, has surely passed.

Which brings us to "The Political Possibilities of the Long Romantic Period." This chapter is so closely related to "Gandhi (and Marx)" in spirit, argument, and content, that they together constitute and mutually support (pillar-like) an argument for the political possibilities of romanticism. Indeed I regard these two chapters as a statement of Bilgrami's romanticism, not only because Bilgrami locates Gandhi and Marx in the tradition of romanticism, and, by implication, himself, but also because this chapter further elaborates -- and complicates -- the argument for regarding the natural world as a source of normative demands, and, moreover, because it makes a very compelling case for romanticism -- in the long periodization of it he frames -- as the bearer, perhaps, the most important bearer, of a distinctly secular conceptual and cultural repertoire of enchantment.

Making insightful and methodical use of M. H. Abrams' classic Natural Supernaturalism, Bilgrami creates the conceptual space for rethinking the relation between natural and supernatural, such that in addition to representing a contrast between what is natural and what is sacred and between what is immanent and what is transcendent, it also comes to represent a contrast between "the idea of the natural as what the natural sciences study and the supernatural as what falls outside of the coverage of the natural sciences" (182). With this third distinction we gain clearer access to the secular repertoire of re-enchantment that romanticism bears and transmits: "not only the words on our pages and on our lips and not only the images on our canvases, but objects and things in the world, including in nature, are filled with properties of value and meaning" (183).

It is a kind of seeing and hearing that is also an act of resistance, whose beginnings Bilgrami traces back to the radical sects of the 17th century, thus stretching the romantic period backwards and forwards in historical time, enlarging not only its historical but also its political significance. If it is the case that for many centuries from the classical to the medieval world, the influence of Aristotle was such that it was common and uncontroversial for human beings to believe that "value is everywhere present in the perceptible world," why, asks Bilgrami, "in the hands of the Romantics, Blake say, does it come off as an act of resistance to take this view of nature and the world" (187)? The answer: because the beginnings of romanticism that Bilgrami traces back to the radical sects of 17th century England are co-extensive with the emergence of the metaphysical outlook and ontology of naturalism, which is itself embedded in, and is the intellectual justification of, the worldly alliances that entrenched the modern sources of alienation and disenchantment.

So we have two contrasting beginnings, representing different possibilities for human forms of life on this planet. Since the political possibilities represented by romanticism have been generally dismissed as irrelevant to the modern world, most influentially by Isaiah Berlin, for whom romanticism is ultimately a futile and nostalgic, not to mention politically dangerous, expression of Counter-Enlightenment energies and thought, anyone who attempts to think anew about the meaning and possibilities of our romantic inheritance, as Bilgrami does, must battle against the received dogmas that serve to block our access to it. I find his response to  these dogmas not only highly congenial, but also highly original.[1] It involves an elaborate and complex contrast -- which I must summarize rather brutely -- between two frames, one of which is the dominant "collective, public understanding" entrenched since its emergence in the 17th century, and the other of which is the "frame of quotidian life," which is a repository of responses to the value-properties of the world that the first frame blocks out. Each of these frames is insulated from the other analogous to the way in which, according to Freud, the human mind creates partitions within itself to cope with (threatening) internal inconsistencies.[2] What is called for, claims Bilgrami, is

a politics that first brings to our consciousness that we have been locked in two frames and succeeds in removing that boundary and . . . in doing so, brought to our consciousness the inconsistency in our response and judgments that we were hitherto unaware of. If this happens . . . there is a serious chance that we will be able to remove these inconsistencies . . . seeing in the resources of the quotidian frame the possibilities of radical criticism of the thinking that takes place (and has taken place for some three centuries) in the collective frame. And, moreover, if this happens, the criticism will not be from the collective outlook of some bygone period available only in nostalgic fantasies but from the resources within the quotidian frame of our mind in one's own time. (209-210)

The chapter, "Occidentalism, the Very Idea," one of the book's two outer pillars, is subtitled, "An Essay on the Enlightenment, Enchantment, and the Mentality of Democracy." It responds to and integrates two apparently disconnected themes. The first is the emergence of a new cold war, this one between the West and Islam, the outlines of which were announced in 1993 by Samuel Huntington's influential article, "The Clash of Civilizations?". Bilgrami takes one of the many books written in the wake of Huntington's article, and the series of ongoing wars in the Middle East, as the occasion to closely examine the underlying assumptions of this so-called clash. Although he considers Occidentalism: The West in the Eyes of Its Enemies, by Ian Buruma and Avishai Margalit, "slight and haphazard in argument" it is a good example of the way in which warring sides in a cold war are joined in the public realm "by academics and other writers, shaping attitudes and rationalizing or domesticating the actions of states and the interests that drive them" (280). However slight or haphazard the book's argument may be, Bilgrami believes it's very important to analyze "what goes wrong in this sort of cold war writing" (286). His analysis, sadly but not surprisingly, is even more pertinent today than when it was written.

Buruma and Margalit seek to turn the tables on Edward Said's famous and influential critique of Orientalism by showing that the conception of the West underlying Occidentalism is "just as unfair and dehumanizing of the West as 'Orientalism' was said to be of the Orient" (281). But what Bilgrami's critical, dis-integrating analysis reveals, is an argument that moves illicitly between a culturally "thin" easy to defend conception of rationality and a culturally "thick" one that is harder to defend, but which does all the real work: "dismissing all opposition as irrationalist, with the hope that the accusations of irrationality, because of the general stigma that the term imparts in its 'thin' usage, will disguise the very specific and 'thick' sense of rationality and irrationality that are actually being deployed by them" (301). Of course, as Bilgrami points out, the critique of this thick conception of rationality has been the target not just of the so-called enemies of the West, but also of the long tradition of critique that emerged in the West with the radical sects of the 17th century and that has been renewed again and again ever since in the work of intellectuals, social movements, and grass-roots organizations.

About two-thirds into the chapter, as he pivots from a discussion of Occidentalism to a discussion of democracy, it becomes clear why at the beginning of the chapter, Bilgrami announced that underlying the debates over our Enlightenment inheritance (science, rationality, democracy) "nothing short of the democratic ideal is at stake" (280). It is here that Bilgrami integrates the key themes of the Gandhi and romanticism chapters with a discussion of the costs of disenchantment in red state America and the phenomenon of epistemic inequality. That discussion is prefaced by the question of how we can "trust in the judgment of ordinary people," on which trust in the idea of democracy has to depend (312). But how can we place our political trust in ordinary people whose "conservative religiosity we often find to be at odds with our most basic political commitments" (312)?

Bilgrami's response to this unavoidable question draws once again upon the distinction between two insulated frames of sense-making and intelligibility, which, through the distortions of institutional and political processes have produced not just partitioning to cope with cognitive inconsistencies but also epistemic inequality, the condition of not having genuine "alternative frameworks for thinking about politics, political economy, and public life" (313). And once again, Bilgrami calls for a radical politics whose task would be to erase the border between these two frames, in this case, to make up the epistemic deficits that undermine and disempower the judgment of ordinary people. Rather than condescendingly dismiss a whole electorate within the West because it falls far short of living up to the values of the Enlightenment, as the mentality of cold war intellectuals such as Buruma and Margalit must, Bilgrami pleads for a greater understanding of

the yearnings of ordinary people for 'enchantment,' for belonging, for the solidarities of community, for some control at a local level for over the decisions by which their qualitative and material lives are shaped, in short, for the kind of substantial democracy that the seemingly irreversible consequences of scientific rationality in the thick sense have made impossible to achieve. (324)

I have saved for last discussion of the first chapter for reasons that will become self-evident. While it does not display substantial thematic differences from the other three pillar-like chapters, it is methodologically different. Quite notably, the language of integration does not figure prominently in it in the way it does in the other three; indeed, there is no explicit mention of it, anywhere. The argument proceeds by stipulation rather than by integration, and that is not just a methodological difference, but also a difference in tone. Its stipulative style of argument suffuses the chapter with a different mood, one could say, in the way that the particular mode of an Indian raga suffuses it with a specific mood.

The view of secularism that Bilgrami proposes here is one that is admirably, to my mind, historicist and contextualist. He does not regard it developmentally as do theorists of secularization. Secularism is a normative position shaped by certain ideals and goals, which it serves to promote, and by which it is shaped "in very specific contexts . . . It is not a goal in itself" (27). Bilgrami wants to "fix the concept" of secularism (2), providing it with a non-arbitrary and minimalist definition, and a justification of its truth that relies only on internal reasons (7), i.e., reasons that are grounded in an agent's values and commitments. The motivation driving his proposal is his belief that Charles Taylor's reformulation of the concept of secularism is theoretically deficient, misguided by the honorable goal of making secularism more responsive to the pluralism of modern democratic societies.

Bilgrami worries that Taylor's conception of secularism is too state-neutralist, too equidistant from the different religions within a pluralist society, and so not sufficiently clear about the stance towards religion that secularism must minimally (but not always inflexibly) take. Thus, he offers a rather austere and minimalist definition of secularism, (S), which stipulates that whenever "a religion's practices are inconsistent with the ideals that a polity seeks to achieve . . . there is a lexicographic ordering in which the political ideals are placed first" (12). Such a lexicographical ordering is necessary and essential, argues Bilgrami, in order to protect expressions of liberty such as free speech or to protect gender equality. Otherwise, we may have a situation in which

fraternal deliberation with all voices involved yields a policy that evenhandedly bans novels and films considered blasphemous by various religions, and if it does, the policy will also count such an outcome as secular since Taylor's criterion of fraternal and equal participation of freely speaking voices will be satisfied. The point is that (S), however, will never count such an outcome as secular, so long as free speech is an ideal one begins with. The adoption of the policy will always fall afoul of the lexicographical ordering that is essential to (S)'s formulation of secularism. And just for that reason, I am saying, (S) has things more theoretically right about what secularism is. (17)

I'm not sure I know what it means to be "more theoretically right about what secularism is," since deeply contested notions like secularism, saddled with an equally deep history, are not the kinds of things about which one can be theoretically right, as though there were just one theoretically correct answer to the question of what secularism is. Given Bilgrami's commitment to genealogical forms of inquiry, one would expect him to share the view Nietzsche stated in The Genealogy of Morals (II, 13), according to which "only that which has no history can be defined." On this view, there can be no fixing of the meaning of contested and contestable notions like secularism, and if that is the case then it is difficult to see how (S) can uncontestably play the political, indeed, constitutional, role that Bilgrami assigns it.

As he has assigned its function, (S) looks more like a Rawlsian constitutional essential, than I think Bilgrami would (or should) be comfortable with. As Rawls's radical democratic critics have argued, the constitutional essentials underpinning Rawlsian liberalism are stipulated in advance of democratic politics instead of being their outcome. So it would appear that between these two competing conceptions of secularism there is also an issue about how far one can trust processes of democratic deliberation and contestation, in this case, the political exchange of internal reasons. But this would also expose an inconsistency in Bilgrami's own view, which, as my summary of the chapter on "Occidentalism" shows, commitment to the "democratic ideal" necessarily involves a "trust in the judgment of ordinary people."

A further inconsistency seems to arise between the justification of (S) in terms of internal reasons alone, and the function of (S) in cases of conflict, where (S) functions as a context-independent standard, to wit, as though it were an external reason, hovering above the normative space of internal reasons (the normative space of an overlapping consensus), taking a regulative and regulatory position above them. Moreover, this context-independent function of (S) seems to put Bilgrami's version of secularism in unwelcome conflict with the practices of democratic deliberation and contestation. Fraternal practices of deliberation and contestation may produce an outcome that is democratic, but which can nonetheless never count as secular by the standards of (S). The appearance of this unwelcome conflict is reinforced by Bilgrami's view that even if the secular regime established in Atatürk's Turkey is illiberal, by the standards of (S), "the authoritarian properties of that regime do nothing to cancel the secularist nature of the regime . . . Not all secularism need be liberal secularism" (23). I don't think Bilgrami should be making this functionalist argument for (S). If secularism as defined by (S) is compatible with authoritarian, highly undemocratic societies, then there is something profoundly wrong with this instrumental, normatively neutral definition of secularism.

If I have expressed some of my worries about the specifics of (S), I can only cheer on Bilgrami's efforts to think of the conflicts between religion and politics as not only open to resolution by internal reasons alone, but also as historically open-ended to further articulations of internal reasons. In an avowedly Hegelian move, Bilgrami conceives of moral and political conflicts as open to a future resolution through a dialogical process of inclusiveness and patience, leaving room for the other to come around, so to speak, benefitting from the way that the exchange of internal reasons between interlocutors draws into the open conflicts within an agent's own value commitments, thereby enabling, potentially, a process of normative and political change. This supposes, as Bilgrami argues, a relation of interdependence between caring for others and caring for the truth (46). It is this commitment to truth and to others that opens up the space in which the lexicographical ordering that (S) requires is relaxed, put in abeyance, leaving open the dialogical pathways of fraternalist deliberation and contestation involving both secularist and anti-secularist voices. But then it is not (S) that is doing all the real normative and political work but rather the integration of caring for others with caring for the truth, which seems to me to be a much more promising path for Bilgrami, and much more consistent with his other value commitments, including methodological values, that he has so ably articulated in this magnificent book.

I am looking forward to the next iteration of Bilgrami's project, whose value, as I said, consists in much, much more than a contribution to our understanding of the efficacy of practical reason, and more even than the integrating (and dis-integrating) style of thought his book so brilliantly exemplifies. I think the greatest value of this project lies in the suggestive outline of the ethical and political possibilities of secular forms of enchantment, the realization of which could offer real hope for a constructive response to the enormous and unprecedented challenges of the age. In this respect, Bilgrami is not only a worthy successor of Said's critical humanism but also a compelling and eloquent exponent of "a special and unusual version of humanism" (44), a more capacious humanism that makes room for a re-enchantment of the world, a humanism whose time, perhaps, has finally come.

[1] For a complementary account of the possibilities of romanticism, see Nikolas Kompridis, "Romanticism" in Richard Eldridge (ed), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy and Literature (Oxford University Press, 2009) pp. 247-270. See also, Nikolas Kompridis (ed.), Philosophical Romanticism (Routledge, 2006), for a range of essays on "philosophical romanticism," which work with a periodization that sees it as a living, not a historically specific, tradition.

[2] In this chapter and the one on "Occidentalism," Bilgrami draws creatively on Davidson's essay on Freud, but in ways Davidson would not have dreamed of. See Donald Davidson, "Two Paradoxes of Irrationality," in R. Wollheim and J. Hopkins (eds.) Philosophical Essays on Freud (Cambridge University Press, 1982) pp. 289-305.