Seeing and Saying: The Language of Perception and the Representational View of Experience

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Berit Brogaard, Seeing and Saying: The Language of Perception and the Representational View of Experience, Oxford University Press, 2018, 205pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190495251.

Reviewed by Mohan Matthen, University of Toronto


In this highly original and tightly argued monograph, Berit Brogaard argues that perceptual experience has representational content in more than a minimal sense. She argues for this by (1) analysing the grammatical structure of sentences in which the main verbs are those of appearance (‘seems,’ ‘appears’) and perception (‘looks,’ ‘sounds,’ ‘feels,’ etc.), (2) arguing that there is a semantically well-defined subset of these that describe phenomenal appearances, and (3) appealing to cognitive science to show that these visual experiences are representational in a non-trivial way.

Brogaard sets the table by recounting the debate between naïve realism (NR), on which perception is direct unmediated contact with objects, and representationalism, which argues that the link to objects goes through representational content. She is a representationalist, because she wants to establish that perceptual states possess information-bearing structure that governs their participation in computational processes in the brain (6). However, there are “minimal and uninteresting” forms of content (5) that NR ought to countenance (2-4). Take content as accuracy conditions. There is no reason why NR should not allow that a red ball might look blue under certain conditions, while still insisting that the ball remains a constituent of visual experience. This would imply that visual experience has accuracy conditions, though it says nothing about information-bearing structures in the brain. Brogaard thinks that content as accuracy conditions is “clearly rather insignificant” (5). She is concerned with a more demanding conception of representation that is “more in line with traditional cognitive science than with the newer enactivist theories” (6).

Brogaard’s chapter 1 argues that (while accuracy conditions are extensional) perceptual verbs create hyperintensional contexts, like those of belief and imagination. A hyperintensional context is one that does not permit the inter-substitution of necessarily co-extensional terms salva veritate, and one in which “the normal existential commitments of names [and of other referring terms such as perceptual demonstratives and object variables? MM] in the complement are suspended” (58). The content that occurs within these contexts is essentially representational, and in her conception, it has the syntactic structure that allows it to interact with other mental states in the way envisaged by traditional cognitive science. This is what a traditional cognitive scientist wants, but the naïve realist does not allow. This clear statement is a welcome clarification of the dispute Brogaard will take up.

Brogaard’s main argument for content of this kind relies on a syntactic and semantic analysis of perceptual reports. Start with the view of perceptual language that she opposes (successfully, in my opinion). Some say that sentences of the form,

(1) X seems F


(2) X looks F

are of subject-predicate form and attribute the properties seems F and looks F to the objects that stand in for ‘X.’ But, says Brogaard, these sentences are deceptive with respect to their underlying logical form; they are in fact “subject-raised” forms of an underlying and more fundamental form (presumably at LF, in the terminology of linguistic theory).

(3) It seems that X is F.


(4) It looks as if X is F.

(3) and (4) lack subjects: “it” is a non-referential dummy in each. If this is correct — and here, I think, Brogaard is on firm ground — then X is only apparently the subject in (1) and (2). In reality, it is firmly attached to the embedded sentential complement, ‘X is F.’ (See most of chapter 1, and chapter 2, 48-49.) These contexts are hyperintensional. So, perception is representational.

There is a lacuna in this argument. One could allow that ‘seems’ and ‘looks’ take propositional complements because of their syntax, but that they are hyperintensional because of default, but defeasible, characteristics of the mental states that they describe. Naïve realists suggest that perception is different from belief because it establishes a direct link between subject and perceptual object. It could be that this direct link renders a normally hyperintensional context extensional. We can allow that perceptual reports share with beliefs etc. a characteristic that they inherit from the generic grammar of ‘seems’ — all of these are directed to an embedded representation of a state-of-affairs. But it could be that when used perceptually, ‘seems’ is extensional. There is a further question here: Are perceptual states the way that “traditional cognitive science” claims? I can’t see anything in the mere syntax of ‘seems’ and ‘looks’ that forces the issue one way or another.

This argument about perceptual verbs is extended in chapter 6. Some naïve realists (e.g., Craig French 2013) appeal to particular constructions involving ‘see’ as support for their position. Consider: ‘I see her’ and ‘I see her standing there.’ These uses lack traces of a finite verb in the complement — they are noun phrases or “unsupported clauses” (138) — and are alleged to be “perceptual” uses of the verb, by contrast with ‘I see that she is standing there,’ which takes a sentential complement. When ‘see’ takes an unsupported clause as complement, it is non-representational — so it is argued. Accordingly, these locutions are consistent with seeing being a relation between a perceiver and an object or event. Brogaard opposes any such move. Her argument is very subtle and well worth reading. She manages in her brief treatment to cast doubt on a number of positions I had previously taken for granted, including the idea that ‘see’ is factive (a cornerstone of naïve realism).

Now, its abundant virtues notwithstanding, there is something deeply troubling about this whole line of argument (and also the one that it opposes). Brogaard is talking about perceptual reports (and the same is true of NR, though it misconstrues the form of these reports). How much can we infer about the nature of perceptual states from the logical form of perceptual reports? There are a number of problems here. One is that linguistically expressed perceptual reports are not only unreliable — our memory of the states we report is evanescent, at best — but also context-dependent. For example, Arend and Reeves (1986) show that reports about colour constancy vary according to what question is asked. So, one might ask: why should we assume that perceptual states are well-described by the language of ‘seems’ and ‘looks?’

Even more worrisome, the language of appearance is generally designed for talk about inter-subjectively accessible states of affairs. For there is ample reason to think that it is not the primary aim of perceptual appearance reports to capture the phenomenal character of sensory states. For example, ‘Round things look square from far away’ says something that is potentially the subject of legitimate inter-subjective agreement or disagreement (as a purely phenomenal report would not be). Of course, linguistic intuition tells us such statements also capture a qualitative aspect of the subject’s experience. But clearly, they depend less on the latter than on the former. For even if, as it turned out, two subjects had very different qualitative experiences of roundness, they could still agree about the reports exampled above. So, it’s not prima facie absurd to hold that the primary uses of these ‘seems’ and ‘looks’ reports is to report the condition of external things.

Let us then say, for the sake of argument, that when somebody says ‘That looks red,’ they generally mean to convey something about the object in question — that it is red, at least as far as how it seems to this person. Now, as noted earlier, Brogaard makes a compelling case that this sentence doesn’t have X as a subject. Rather, it has the form, < — looks as if X is red> (where the dash is meant to indicate the missing subject). But this is consistent with my suggestion that such locutions might prototypically be meant to convey something about X — not that it is definitely red, but that the speaker is prepared to certify that it is red (with a degree and source of conviction that may or may not be indicated in context). In some cases, of course, one could use this form of words to indicate the source of one’s confidence — a perceptual appearance, for instance. But this is a secondary use of the locution.

Now, it is true that what I have just described is an epistemic use of ‘looks.’ And, as I will relate, Brogaard thinks that perceptual uses of this term are non-epistemic. However, the distinction between epistemic and non-epistemic uses is semantic or pragmatic, not syntactic. In circumstances where the redness of a perceptual object is not in question, I could use the words, ‘That looks red,’ to convey something about my visual experience. But this could be a derived or indirect reading that only contextual cues can force. The logical form of the perceptual report need not, therefore, be explained by the representational form of perceptual appearance. Rather, it might be explained by what I usually certify when I say ‘That looks red’ — my confidence that it is red under that representational aspect.

Brogaard argues, citing the “disquotational principle” as justification, that since ‘look’ is a hyperintensional operator, looks are representational states (9). But this plainly does not follow, and certainly not across the board. For the disquoted sentence might not come with contextual cues that governed the original utterance. (A more radical approach would be to conclude that all looks-statements are false; Brogaard doesn’t give reasons against this either.) Consider, then the following dialogue:

Me (talking to a theatre-director during a lighting-rehearsal): That looks red.

You (the next day in ordinary tungsten lighting): What you said is true if and only if that looks red. And it doesn’t.

It could be argued that the import of the sentence has changed — when the lighting was being tested, I was saying something about how things looked to me (and presumably others in the audience); now the focus is on the object itself. But this change is not reflected in the syntax of the sentence. It still has an embedded sentential clause, but the ‘looks’ need not be construed hyperintensionally.

In any case, it seems that any syntactic implicature can be cancelled. For in a cognitive science seminar, a dynamical systems theorist might say: “That looks red, and looking red is non-representational.” She hasn’t contradicted herself, has she? You can’t adjudicate research programs like these just by examining the grammar of ‘looks.’

Here, I want to make clear, it is not Brogaard’s view alone that I find problematic in this way. Ever since J.L. Austin, the philosophical literature has been rife with arguments that purport to show that our ordinary ways of speaking show this or that about perception — for example, that things cannot look the way they patently are. Naïve realists are, of course, major miscreants in this lineup, and it’s right for Brogaard to appeal to linguistic theory to call them out. But the rules of this game do not seem to dictate which factors involved in perceptual reports should be given systematic attention — the historical provenance of grammatical form, the pragmatics of communication, prosody and emphasis, and so on. There seems to be no checklist. In empirical psychophysics, there is an established methodology, however inadequate some find it to be. In linguistic philosophy, it seems, systematicity is deemed unnecessary. Brogaard’s use of linguistic theory is on a more solid footing than some of the spot-inspection techniques used by ordinary language philosophers, but it still partakes of a suspect methodology.

I will skip ahead now to a central point of Brogaard’s treatment of representationalism. She argues, first of all, that some looks-statements reflect phenomenal states. Now, it is common in the philosophy of perception to distinguish several senses of ‘looks.’ In the comparative sense, ‘looks F’ means ‘looks like an F’ or ‘looks like something that is F.’ Somebody looks Scandinavian in this sense if they are blonde and have pale skin. (This is Brogaard’s example, not mine.) Note that looking Scandinavian in the comparative sense does not imply being Scandinavian. Epistemic uses of ‘looks’ are used to signal that the subject believes, or at least is somewhat inclined to believe, the embedded clause. Thus, these uses of the term describe states that ought to weaken or change when the subject is presented with contrary evidence. If I say “Ö1024 looks irrational,” I am reporting my inclination to endorse, or bet on, the proposition. This ought to change when I punch 32*32 into a calculator.

According to Brogaard, phenomenal perceptual states are those picked out by (true) ‘looks’ statements that are neither comparative nor epistemic. When I say ‘That looks red’ non-comparatively and non-epistemically, then if it is true, it picks out a phenomenal state. Note, once again, the claim that this marks a distinct use or sense of ‘looks.’ Why not just say that there are looks or seemings that do not incline one to believe the complement and do not retreat when the complement is shown to be false? This would be a claim about the states, not the reports.

Let me now go to a related point: Brogaard claims that the non-comparative, non-epistemic use of ‘looks’ picks out phenomenal states that are representational. I’ll consider one very strong part of her argument.

Perception is variable among perceivers. One example is colour perception. People vary quite a lot with respect to the spectral sensitivity profiles of the cone cells that form the receiving front-end of colour vision: my long-wavelength cone might, for example, have a profile that is slightly displaced towards the long-wavelength end of the visible spectrum relative to yours. Now: since perceived colours are based on opponent functions of cone-cell responses, the effect of this displacement of my long-wave cone cell would be that the colour properties that I represent are slightly different in physical terms than yours: what I perceive as a specific shade of red (call it Red*) will be a somewhat different property than what you perceive as that same shade of red. Red* is a certain value of a function O(L, M, S) of the three cone-cell responses under exposure to standardized light — let’s say isochromatic light, but it doesn’t matter as long as we have a standard. (Surface colour is defined in terms of O — how exactly is irrelevant here.)

This has a rather simple consequence. When we ask what ‘looks Red*’ means, then assuming that we are looking for an object-property in the complement, we have to cite O. But then there is no one answer across the board. Since my L-response is different from yours, the value of my O-function will systematically differ from yours given the same optical stimulation. Thus, Red* is one colour property to me, another to you. Brogaard writes: “one and the same set of surface spectral reflectances can give rise to different qualitatively perceived colour properties in different perceivers” (90). I would put the point slightly differently to emphasize differences among perceivers with regard to their colour ontologies. The same phenomenal experience of colour is (normally and non-deviantly) experience of different properties in perceivers differently constituted.

Now, there are those who contest the above argument, but this review is not the place to take them up. (See, however, Matthen, forthcoming.) The essential point to be taken from the conclusion is that the relationship between perceivers and colour properties is mediated by the perceiver’s visual system. Brogaard uses this to contest naïve realism. (To be fair, naïve realists emphasize mind-independence, and Brogaard contests vision-independence, but let’s leave that argument for another occasion. See, however, Allen 2015 for a form of naïve realism that nicely captures the tension.) As she writes: “a perceptual relation between the perceiver and a mind-independent, external object does not suffice for explaining the different phenomenal seemings that one and the same perceptual object can give rise to in different individuals” (90). Bracketing the point about vision-independence vs. mind-independence, this is an important challenge to naïve realism.

So far, so good. A satisfactory explanation of this kind of variation would have to appeal to the differences between your cone cells and mine — more broadly, between what your visual system does with information that enters through receptor cells and what mine does with it — a mediacy buried by naïve realism. This said, Brogaard’s continuation begs the question. For she concludes: “We must appeal to the very notion of a phenomenal seeing to explain the different phenomenology of the experiences of different individuals” (ibid). My difficulty here is why we should think that it’s a difference of phenomenology that is at issue here. After all, two robots equipped with cone cells and colour opponent processing could come up with the same ontological differences with regard to colour-detection in some non-phenomenal manner. More importantly, there is nothing in the above account that demands representation. Why can’t an enactivist, or dynamical systems theorist, or other anti-representationalist embrace the story about perceptual variation as long as they are willing to accept the relevance of visual system-characteristics in defining what colours are. Brogaard invokes “the fundamental status of the representational feature of experience” here (92), but this is premised on the hyperintentionality of ‘looks’ and is neutral with regard to how perceptual variation is explained. There is nothing specifically about perceptual variation that forces us to acknowledge phenomenal seeing or representational content.

In chapter 7, Brogaard turns to non-visual modalities. It turns out that the non-visual perceptual verbs resist uniform treatment. So, ‘It sounds like John is getting a cold’ can be subject-raised to ‘John sounds like he is getting a cold.’ But ‘It sounds like Peter is walking in the hallway’ cannot be raised to ‘Peter sounds like he is walking in the hallway.’ (151-52) Why? Perhaps because audition doesn’t, by itself, put us in contact with Peter, only with the sound that he makes. Why, then, does the first sentence work differently? Further, there are no phenomenal uses of ‘sounds’: there is something odd about ‘That musical note sounds high-pitched.’ Acknowledging these anomalies, Brogaard rests with comparative uses to make her point. ‘X sounds like Y’ means: ‘There is a way w that is the way Y sounds, and w is the way X sounds.’ She uses this to construct an analogy of the arguments about vision outlined earlier — hyperintensional contexts imply representation; perceptual variation implies phenomenality of representation. Similar arguments are offered for smell and taste. Perhaps I am missing the point, but I found all of this a bit ad hoc. The argument about vision rested firmly on the grammar of ‘seems,’ ‘looks,’ and ‘sees.’ The grammar of ‘sounds,’ smells,’ and ‘tastes’ turns out to be crucially different. Yet, they are brought into the fold in a very simple way. “In spite of these differences, ‘sound,’ ‘smell,’ ‘taste,’ and ‘feel’ have genuine non-epistemic uses. So, the corresponding perceptual reports express soundings, smellings, tastings, and feelings.” (179) So, did we really need all of the detail about ‘looks’ and ‘sees?’

To conclude, I can’t resist mentioning Brogaard’s sometimes idiosyncratic choice of sentence-examples. These are sometimes a little suggestive (‘Mary felt his grip make her breathing ragged and shallow’ is a ‘feel’-report with an unsupported clause), sometimes whimsical (‘Tom wants the Audi R8 V10’ shows a non-relational object-directed construction), and sometimes downright macabre (‘When one of my cats dies, I lay the cat out on a towel so the other cats can see that their buddy is gone’ illustrates a non-epistemic use of ‘see that’). Very arresting, in the midst of this dry technical material, and all to the good (I guess).

To sum it all up: this is really important work. Though I don’t accept that the logical form of perceptual reports reveals anything about the neural structure of visual states, I learned a lot from this book and thoroughly enjoyed reading it.


Warm thanks to Jonathan Cohen for very helpful comments.


Allen, Keith (2015). “Colour Physicalism, Naïve Realism, and the Argument from Structure,”

Minds and Machines 25/2 (May): 193-212.

Arend, L and A. Reeves (1986). “Simultaneous Color Constancy,” Journal of the Optical Society of America 3/10 (October): 1743-51.

French, Craig (2013). “Perceptual Experience and Seeing That p,” Synthese 190/10: 1735-51.

Matthen, Mohan (forthcoming). “The Unique Hues and Colour Experience,” in D. Brown and F. Macpherson (eds.) Routledge Handbook on the Philosophy of Colour London: Routledge.