Seeing, Doing, and Knowing: A Philosophical Theory of Sense Perception

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Mohan Matthen, Seeing, Doing, and Knowing: A Philosophical Theory of Sense Perception, Oxford University Press, 2005, 384pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199268509.

Reviewed by Fred Dretske, Duke University


This book is about seeing, to a lesser extent about doing, and not much at all about knowing. It is not a book on epistemology. The word "knowledge" is not even in the index. So forget about barn facades and painted mules. The topic is sense perception. It is about seeing objects and their properties (mainly color), not the fact that objects have these properties. It is about seeing red apples, not that they are red.

About this topic Matthen has many fascinating things to say -- so many, in fact, that it is hard, at times, to track the argument. At the end of the book we are given a list of definitions and named theses. There are -- count them -- forty-six theses. Some of these are contested, but most are defended. That's a lot of theses to juggle -- far too many to permit useful summary in a review. So I won't try. I will instead try to give what I see as the primary thrust of the book and ignore the technical skirmishing (much of it about color perception). It is important to state up front, though, that much of the value of this book lies in the technical details. Matthen is a first-class philosopher with an imposing command of the scientific literature. Even if one doesn't agree with the big picture he paints (I don't), you will surely learn an enormous amount by watching him paint it (I did).

There are two or three ideas that are absolutely central to the book. The first of these is the classificatory nature of sensory systems: the senses are automatic "sorting machines" that assign distal stimuli to various classes. That sounds familiar enough -- not to say completely obvious -- until we are told that the features these stimuli appear to have are the result, not the basis, of the sense's classificatory activity. Vision does not assign red apples (fire engines, blood, etc.) to one class and green apples (grass, peas, leaves) to another class because the red things are (or look) red and the green things are (or look) green. Vision does not detect an objective property the red things have and a different objective property the green things have. No, the red apples look different from the green ones because vision sorts these apples into different classes. Developing the implications of this thesis, the Sensory Classification Thesis, is the job of Chapter 1 and, indeed, of much of the rest of the book.

Wait a minute, you say: Why does vision sort things this way? Why does it put red and green apples into different classes (thus making them look different to us)? Is this just arbitrary? Does vision, as it were, flip a coin when an apple moves into view, the "heads" going in one class (the red apple class), the "tails" in another (the green apple class)? No. That would be extreme nominalism (about color), and Matthen is no nominalist. There is, he assures us, a right and a wrong about sensory classification, but the correctness of the classification derives not so much from the apples themselves, from what properties they have, as from the perceiver's response (or dispositions to respond) to these stimulus objects. If the classification of an apple disrupts some species-typical activity of the perceiver, the classification is wrong. If it promotes this activity, it is right. So it turns out that there are objective standards for correctness. Since pigeons (tetrachromats) have different ways of usefully responding to apples than humans (trichromats), their color classification of apples may be quite different from ours. Some evolutionarily favored form of activity may be disrupted in them, but not in us, by classifying things a certain way. This means that they, but not necessarily we, would be misclassifying things that way. What this means is that the standards for correct classification can be different for different sensory systems. It doesn't mean that these (relative) standards are not objective. Humans might see A and B as the same color while a pigeon sees them as different colors, and, yet, we can both be right.

This is the thesis of pluralistic realism, a thesis that threads a fine line between subjectivism (the color we experience is in the mind of the perceiver) and realism (the color is an objective property of the object being perceived). Matthen is a realist: color is physically specifiable, an objective property. He is also a pluralist: this property is different for different animals. It is different for different animals because (and here we get to the doing in the title, another important theme of the book) the color that a thing is experienced as having (= the color class the animal's sensory system assigns the object) is a response-relative classification. It is, in this way, a relational property. It relates to what the perceiving animal is innately disposed to do with that kind of object. Since different animals have different useful responses to objects, they can have cross-cutting sensory classifications. Color (and presumably much else in our experience of objects) is objectively real, yes, but it isn't (as we take it to be) a property (at least not a monadic property) of objects we experience. It is, rather, the result of sensory sorting activities that had in their evolutionary development useful (adaptive) responses as their target. Animals in different ecological niches with different biological needs will, as a consequence, see the world differently, but this will not prevent them (when working according to design) from seeing the world correctly. Seeing the world correctly is just classifying visual input in ways that promote the responses the organism found useful (adaptive) in its evolutionary development. Sensory systems present the world to the perceiver in action-related terms.

I dwell on color here because most of this book is devoted to our perception of color. I'm not sure how plausible any of this would be if we concentrated not on color (secondary properties in general) but, say, shape, location, or orientation. It might be that a pigeon (who puts A and B in different color classes) and I (who put them in the same) can both be right, but what could it mean to correctly put a triangle and a circle in the same shape class? Could we still be talking about shape? I should think anyone who co-classified these shapes would either have bad eyesight -- they just didn't see the difference -- or had no interest (need, purpose) in distinguishing them. It wouldn't mean they were right (correct!) in classifying them as the same shape. This, though, is a question about how far one can generalize the claims Matthen advances in the book. It isn't an objection to any actual thesis since Matthen is often careful to express these theses in terms of our perception of color.

This is a pretty crude, and therefore probably misleading, overview of a richly textured theory that is developed in the first four parts of the book. The book, however, bubbles with important ideas. Part Five, my favorite, is devoted to reference -- the way vision locates the features it presents. Matthen argues, persuasively, that vision is an object (not location) centered system. What bears the features vision (not necessarily other senses) presents us with are moveable objects, not immovable locations. He also develops an intriguing hypothesis about the "feeling of presence" of genuine perception as opposed to vivid imagery. In vivid imagery (just as in viewing objects depicted in pictures) the motion-guiding visual system (the dorsal system, the one that operates unconsciously in guiding movements) is not engaged. This gives rise to a phenomenal difference that is distinct from the set of features presented by the conscious (ventral) visual system. There is, therefore, a phenomenal difference between experiences that are otherwise feature-identical. Though Matthen doesn't present it this way, this strikes me as an interesting argument against representational theories of experience. If he is right, something contributes to "what it is like" to have an experience that is not to be found, as representationalists (like me) claim, in the properties the experience represents things to have.

Reviewers are supposed to have something negative to say. In compliance with this universally observed (in philosophy) obligation, I end by registering an objection to the scheme presented in this book. It seems to me that if sensory classification is not to be completely arbitrary, it must be based on (a response to, a causal result of) similarities and differences in the input from the (distal) stimuli being classified. It can't rest solely on the downstream effects of classification on an organism's potential responses, on what the organism or its evolutionary ancestors found it useful to do when confronted with that kind of object. If the effects of A and B on S's sensory system are the same, classifying them differently makes no sense. Even if, for concealed reasons (e.g., A is poisonous, B is not), classifying them differently would be beneficial, there are no rational grounds, no basis, for treating them differently. Such classificatory activity would be a chance affair of no possible adaptive value. Classifications of A and B that are useful must be based on facts about A and B that are available to S before S decides how to react to A and B. If there is, therefore, something about colored things on which a useful classification can be based, then there must be information in the sensory input from colored objects on which the sorting procedure relies: A has this property, or one of this range of properties, and B does not. This leaves the question: why isn't this information, information about A and B available in the sensory input before S reacts to A and B, the property that constitutes the difference between red and green apples? But if this is so, then, contrary to the thrust of this book, we are left with perception that is independent of doing. We would, in fact, be back to an information-based account of sense experience.