Seeing Fictions in Film: The Epistemology of Movies

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George M. Wilson, Seeing Fictions in Film: The Epistemology of Movies, Oxford University Press, 2011, 220pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199594894.

Reviewed by Paisley Livingston, Lingnan University


When George M. Wilson began to write about film in the 1970s, film theory was high on a cocktail of semiology, psychoanalysis, and Marxism. Wilson offered sobering criticisms of this approach and began to develop an alternative.[1] His new book, which synthesizes and updates his results, must be read by anyone who wants to be up to speed on the theory of narrative, narration, and narrators in film and literature.

Wilson's point of departure in this book is the observation that people frequently talk as though they literally saw and heard the things that "happen" in cinematic fictions, such as Dorothy singing and dancing on the yellow brick road that winds its way through Oz. If Dorothy and Oz neither exist nor subsist, or if they are abstract objects, then talk of our immediate perceptual commerce with them cannot literally be true. Yet there is an important difference between statements about (1) the story events explicitly represented in the 1939 cinematic adaptation of A Wizard of Oz, (2) the events that are not explicitly represented by this film, but are part of its story, and (3) what is not part of the story conveyed by this film. Such distinctions are lost on a sweeping error theory about fictional discourse. The way to save them is to identify the defensible propositions that our utterances about these matters might express.

Wilson's approach is broadly Waltonian.[2] He at least provisionally accepts Walton's idea that photographic representations are transparent and enable us to see things indirectly: by looking at the motion picture we can see aspects of Judy Garland's performance on the set. (As Wilson acknowledges, this does not apply in the case of computer-generated imagery.) Wilson also adopts Walton's idea of imagining seeing, which emphasizes the integration of the visual and imaginative elements in the spectator's participation in the games of make-believe authorized for certain works. With regard to fictional truth more generally, Wilson adapts Walton's notion of it being "fictional in a work" and adds that he is "tempted to say that it is fictional in work W that P just in case it is an intended function of some part of aspects of W to prompt audiences of W to imagine that P" (p. 55 n. 4).

Putting these elements together, we have the following schematic elucidation of the propositions expressed by talk of seeing fictions in film. While it would be false to say that the film spectator literally sees and hears Dorothy or anything else in Oz, at a screening of The Wizard of Oz the spectator does see and hear sights and sounds that transparently depict aspects of Judy Garland's performance. The spectator indirectly sees and hears these aspects of the performance, and may justifiably imagine, of this perceptual experience, that he or she is seeing and hearing Dorothy singing and dancing along the yellow brick road. The movie achieves its intended function of a fictional showing of Dorothy, and in response to these images the viewers imagine seeing her.

The originality of Wilson's development of a Waltonian approach to cinematic fiction is partly a matter of his creative exploration of a number of distinctive ways of elaborating, motivating, defending, and applying what he calls the "Imagined Seeing Thesis" and a closely related "Fictional Showing Hypothesis." Wilson's brief statement of the Imagined Seeing Thesis runs as follows:

In viewing classical narrative films under standard conditions of movie spectatorship, viewers normally do imagine seeing (in the image-track) and hearing (in the sound-track) the objects and events depicted in the movie. Further, in normal cases they are justified in so imagining (p. 55).

Wilson introduces three basic variants on this thesis. The first variant, dubbed the "Face-to-Face Version," is a position he advanced in his first book on film.[3] According to this line of thought, in watching a film it is make-believe for the spectator that he or she sees the fictional events directly and from within the fictional world. The second option is the Modest Version: the spectators are to imagine seeing and hearing events in the fictional world, but it is fictionally indeterminate for them whether this imagined perceptual access is mediated or immediate. The third option is the Mediated Version, which comes in several distinct variants, all of which deny that the spectator imagines having immediate or direct perceptual access to the story events. Instead, it is true in the fiction, and part of the spectator's warranted game of make-believe, that these events are presented (made visible or audible) to the spectator, who imagines seeing or hearing them indirectly.

Different variants of the Mediated Version correspond to different assumptions about what, more specifically, is to be imagined about the make-believe mediation that makes possible the spectator's indirect perceptual experience. One of the stronger renditions of the Mediated Version has it that spectators imagine, "falsely but quite legitimately, about the actual shots of the film, that those have been transparently derived from certain visible constituents of the fictional world that the film creates" (p. 90). To make a long story short, Wilson ends up opting for a weaker version: viewers imagine seeing segments of the fictional world in a mediated manner, but "the means or mechanism that constitutes this mediation is, in general, fictionally indeterminate" (pp. 78-79 n. 1). If we read Wilson's "in general" in this last phrase as allowing for exceptions, the weaker version is compatible with the idea that in some cases, the sort of imagining characterized in the stronger version can be prescribed by the work. For example, in some mock documentaries (e.g., Vincent Lannoo's 2001 Strass), we are to imagine that a film crew in the world of the story has made a film that we are imagining seeing, where the image and sound track of the imagined film is type-identical to that of the actual movie.

Wilson painstakingly sets forth considerations weighing for and against the Face-to-Face, Modest, and Mediated Versions of the Imagined Seeing and Fictional Showing Hypotheses. The Face-to-Face Version squares nicely with the fact that the experience of a cinematic story is not just a matter of a propositional imagining to the effect that such-and-such happened in the story, as this sort of fictional content could be had by merely reading a critic's faithful recounting of the film's plot. Instead, at any given moment in the experience of the film, the spectator is given to imagine seeing some segment of the world of the story from a perspective that corresponds to a more or less well-defined location within that world. The Face-to-Face Version also harmonizes with prevalent characterizations of the spectator as imagining moving about within the world of the fiction.[4]

The Face-to-Face Version gives rise to a familiar objection: if we were to imagine ourselves as being situated in the sphere of the story events, would this not let in a host of irrelevant thoughts and questions, such as "How did I get so close to the Wicked Witch and her flying monkeys without them noticing me?" Wilson maintains that when we watch the scene in The Wizard of Oz in which the winged monkeys attack Dorothy and her companions, we are not to imagine ourselves as "moving around among the winged monkeys" (p. 5). Spectators can imagine having a visual experience from a perspective while neither imagining that they occupy that perspective nor that they do not occupy it. More generally, the warranted imaginings prompted by fictions can be partly indeterminate with regard to our mode of epistemic access to the story events.

The Modest Version extends this thought. The spectator is to imagine seeing or hearing the story events, but need not imagine anything specific on the topic of how these events are being presented. The Modest Version thereby forestalls silly questions about the spectator's epistemic and other relations to the items in the story.

Wilson agrees that some questions are indeed silly or irrelevant to the appreciation of a work, but he does not allow that the question of the imagined immediacy or indirectness of our imagined seeing is one of them. Some questions about narration have to be answered if our aim is to describe a sufficiently comprehensive imaginative engagement with the perceptual features of the audio-visual display and the story conveyed by the work. Only the Mediated Version can do this, Wilson contends.

Wilson's main argument in support of this claim is that only if the spectator imagines seeing indirectly can this imagining yield the right sort of intuitions with regard to which perceived qualities of the image- and sound-tracks correspond to story events and which ones do not. Wilson writes:

The non-diegetic visual qualities are experienced as arising from the compositional character of the image-track and as projected onto the movie's narrative world. The Mediated Version of the Imagined Seeing Thesis is called for to articulate the intuitive results of the imagined contrast in each such instance (p. 97).

This contention is illustrated by examples. One of them involves the beginning of Psycho in which the words 'Phoenix, Arizona' appear on a shot of the Phoenix skyline. The spectator who imagines seeing via some kind of mediating image can imagine these words as being inscribed on this image, as opposed to being located, rather implausibly, somewhere in Phoenix.

This reviewer has some doubts about the success of this argument in favor of the Mediated Version, at least insofar as this thesis is held to cover most "classical" narrative films. If this is an argument by elimination, it may be wondered whether all of the other options have really been defeated. If it is an inference to the best explanation, the explanans seems problematic. And there are reasons for doubting that the Mediated Version can be accepted as an elucidation of the pragmatically or contextually "enriched propositions" intended in competent discourse about spectatorship (pp. 67-68).

The film spectator's competence has multiple sources, and there are shorter routes to the desired results than the byways travelled via the Mediated Version, which attributes some intricate and rather arcane thoughts to the spectator, such as the idea that the words 'Phoenix, Arizona' "have been inscribed by some agency onto the imagined transparency of the film image to the dramatized situations" (pp. 93-94). It is more plausible to conjecture that the competent viewer spontaneously understands the words and gets the point without engaging in any make-believe about an inscription, the location of an inscription, or an inscribing performed by an unseen fictional agent. If spectators thought about the provenance of the title that appears onscreen at the outset of Psycho, they would probably reckon that the filmmakers used it to get them to imagine that the story takes place in Phoenix. They can reach this conclusion without imagining that the words were inscribed on an imagined, transparent image of the world of the story.

We lack an argument establishing that the appreciator's experience of a narrative film ought to include thoughts about some fictional mode of gaining access to the story facts. As Walton once pointed out, imperatives in this domain are not categorical but hypothetical, and have to follow from the goal of appreciating the work in the appropriate manner.[5] What does and does not count as appropriate appreciation is controversial, but here is one line of thought on the topic. People who are good at appreciating films do not simply follow the story, but instead notice and assess the ways in which the story has been designed and presented. They notice and evaluate the choice of film stock and lenses, editing, camera movement, blocking, set design, selective focus, and such. They know something about the actual technological constraints within which the filmmakers were operating and can thereby appreciate what is skillful and innovative in the use of media manifested by a particular work. They need not even entertain the option of attributing the artistry (or lack thereof) involved in the use of the media to some fictional instance. This is to be expected given that the primary focus of their interest -- the audio-visual display -- is known by them to be an artifact produced by the actual filmmakers, who have effectively designed it to convey a story in a manner that may or may not exemplify some species of artistic excellence. In most cases, imaginings about the activities of an internal quasi-cinematic mediation would be a fifth wheel on the cart of appreciating the film. Normally, appreciation requires no make-believe rationalization of the contrast between visual properties of the story world and visual properties of the moving images.

It might be retorted that to appreciate a fictional narrative appropriately always requires an appreciation of its fictional showing or narration. A winning argument to this effect cannot, however, be successfully based on an uncontroversial and sharp concept of narrative because we have no such concept.[6] Wilson comments that the very enterprise of attempting to formulate necessary and sufficient conditions on something's being a narrative is "misguided" (p. 13). A similar verdict may be appropriate with regard to the search for a strong link between narratives and their internalnarrations.

Wilson devotes two chapters to shedding new light on the ongoing debate on the topic of narrators in film and literary works of fiction. With regard to the question of whether movies always or sometimes have audio-visual narrators, he shrewdly remarks that the conceptual underpinnings of this question "are a mess" (p. 56). He provides a probing discussion of differences between "effaced" and other sorts of narrators in film and literature. He asks whether there could be some films with a "strongly robust narrator," that is, a unifying figure manifesting distinctive personal traits and thought to have constructed the narration on his or her own. He plausibly conjectures that on the whole, such a role would be more likely to be played by the implicit author or perhaps even the film's "actual director" (p. 138). Wilson leaves it open whether there are or could be films in which there is a strongly robust narrator who is not the work's actual or implicit author. He also comments that film criticism "needs to recognize a range of movies with modestly robust narrators (under some terminology)" (p. 137).

This short review has passed over many of the topics that Wilson takes up in his fascinating book, such as the different kinds of self-conscious narration that crop up in films. Nor has there been space to raise questions about Wilson's position on the fiction/non-fiction distinction and narration in non-fiction films. I cannot conclude, however, without drawing the reader's attention to Wilson's engaging and convincing interpretations of particular cinematic works, including Fight Club, Josef von Sternberg's last films with Dietrich, and The Man Who Wasn't There. Many philosophers who write about movies are blind to cinematic style and in a hurry to set forth a moral or metaphysical allegory. This is not Wilson's manner. When he does find wisdom in a film, it is often meta-fictional. He also has an eye for films that use irony and unreliability to prompt the spectator's awareness of our cognitive limitations and proneness to attribution errors. His interpretations of particular works astutely combine contextual (e.g., author-related and film-historical) knowledge, careful attention to audio-visual detail, and a sharp grasp of the relevant themes.

In sum, engaging with this challenging book will be crucial to an understanding of ongoing contemporary debates in the philosophy of film. It is highly recommended to both philosophers and film scholars.

[1] George M. Wilson, "Review of Christian Metz's Film Language: A Semiotics of the Cinema," MLN, 89:6 (1974): 1068-72; "Film, Perception, and Point of View," MLN, 91:5 (1976): 1026-43;Narration in Light: Studies in Cinematic Point of View (Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press, 1986).

[2] Kendall L. Walton, Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1990), and Marvelous Images: On Values and the Arts (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008). For some of Wilson's views on Walton's framework, see his "Comments on Mimesis as Make-Believe," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 51:2 (1991): 395-400. For a seldom-cited treatise emphasizing links between play, props, make-believe, children's games, and the fine (and other) arts, see Konrad Lange, Das Wesen der Kunst: Grundzüge einer realistichen Kunstlehre, 2 vols. (Berlin: G. Grote'sche Verlag, 1901).

[3] Wilson, Narration in Light, pp. 53-56.

[4] Katherine J. Thomson-Jones, "Narration in Motion," The British Journal of Aesthetics, 52:1 (2012): 33-43. Thomson-Jones does not explicitly endorse the Face-to-Face Version, but she does insist that we experientially imagine moving within the story space, as when we have the impression of flying over London along with Scrooge and the Ghost of Christmas Past.

[5] Kendall L. Walton, "Reply to Reviewers," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 51:2 (1991): 413-431, at p. 430.

[6] For support of this claim, see my "Narrativity and Knowledge," The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, 67:1 (2009): 25-36.