Seeing, Knowing, Understanding

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Barry Stroud, Seeing, Knowing, Understanding, Oxford University Press, 2018, 277pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809753.

Reviewed by Catherine Z. Elgin, Harvard University


The book consists of a series of articles written between 2001 and 2017. Most were previously published. Apart from a couple of autobiographical pieces, they concern topics in epistemology and related fields that have preoccupied Barry Stroud for many years -- skepticism, perceptual knowledge, color, judgment. Several are his contributions to ongoing debates. Stroud's epistemological position is complex. The papers on seemingly diverse topics are mutually illuminating and mutually reinforcing. Here I will focus on a line of argument that runs through the papers.

Stroud recognizes that Cartesian skepticism is a deep philosophical problem. Many epistemologists disagree. They think that the skeptic's argument suffers from an easily identifiable, easily correctible flaw. Perhaps Descartes set his standards too high; or he was excessively demanding in the range of alternatives that had to be excluded in order to know; or he posed the problem of knowledge of the external world in such a way that he could not exploit the resources that externalist epistemology supplies. Stroud disagrees. He takes skepticism to emerge from a desire for a general answer to the entirely reasonable question: given that the world is as it is almost entirely irrespective of what anyone knows or believes about it, how is it possible for us to know anything about the way the world is? The mind-independence of the world sets the problem. So Stroud maintains that even if we can answer the standard objections, the problem persists. Lowering our standards won't help, since we still have to explain how knowers satisfy the lower standards. Restricting the range of alternatives won't help, since we still need to explain how those alternatives get eliminated. Even opting for an externalist epistemology -- a causal theory or a reliabilist theory or truth tracking -- won't give us what we want. Such a theory might account for an agent's believing truly that s is p. But that's not enough to explain how knowledge is possible. The fact that we are in touch with the way things are does not explain how we are in touch with the way things are.

The problem, as Stroud sees it, concerns the relation of perception to what is perceived. Perception is the interface between a thinker and the world. But the thinker is aware that 'whatever is so beyond what he perceives could be any one of indefinitely many ways compatibly with the limited sensory data he perceives' (46). Perceptual inputs underdetermine what is there to be known. 'On the assumption that knowledge of the world is possible at all only on the basis of what is available to perception, this would leave the theorist unable to understand himself as knowing or having any reason to believe anything about what is so beyond what he perceives to be so' (47). Stroud thinks that skepticism is a reasonable if unfortunate outcome if in fact we perceive things and extrapolate from our perceptual data.

The solution, he believes, is to be an externalist not just about knowledge but about content. If the contents of our attitudes are determined by what those attitudes are about, then merely by having an attitude -- a belief that p is q, or a desire that s be t -- we are in contact with the world. This resolution does not meet the skeptic's original demand: it does not tell us how we could have knowledge or reasonable belief about the world in general. But it does explain how Fred's belief that the cat is on the mat is in fact about the cat and the mat. It explains how (nearly) each contentful attitude puts the agent in contact with the objects of that content. A type of realism emerges.

Put this way, it is too easy. For one thing, we make errors (hence the 'nearly' in the previous paragraph). People believe that they see ghosts, hope that those ghosts are friendly, fear that they are not, and so forth -- even though there are no ghosts. Whatever endows ghost-attitudes with their content, it is not contact with ghosts. Because Stroud's position is a Davidsonian holism, it leaves room for a certain amount of error. We are correct most of the time, but not in every case.

A more serious problem looms. Even if the contents of most of our attitudes are determined by whatever in the world answers to them, how do we knowers get in touch with the world? It may be true that when Anna sees a red apple, the fact that it is a red apple she sees is determined by the way the world is. But how does that fact give her access to the world?

Stroud maintains that the key lies in recognizing that for epistemic agents perception is propositional. Rather than seeing a splotch of red and a roughly spherical shape separately and then somehow amalgamating them, Anna directly sees that the apple is red. There is no room for the skeptic to drive a wedge between her perception and her judgment, for her perception is a judgment. This raises a further question. Humans are not born capable of making such judgments. Babies confronted with red apples are in no position to judge that the apples they encounter are red. Stroud maintains that we acquire the capacity to make perceptual judgments, and indeed all judgments, by learning language. We learn how to predicate one thing of another and how to assign truth values. The language, with its conceptual structures, supplies the framework we need. 'To see and know that there is a red apple on a brown table requires more than seeing those objects. It requires competence in and competent exercise of perceptual and conceptual capacities required for propositional thought about what you perceive' (109-110).

Ordinarily, when epistemologists discuss knowledge of the external world, they think of that world as consisting of material objects extended in space. Stroud recognizes that there is a lot more to the external world than that. In particular there are other people who engage in intentional actions. We frequently know what they think and how they feel, as well as what intentional actions they are performing. To know such things about others, Stroud maintains, requires knowing such things about ourselves.

A toddler who falls and hurts himself can, of course, be in pain. He can, moreover, express his pain by crying. But being pre-linguistic, he cannot ascribe the pain to himself. Nor, Stroud maintains, can he think of himself as in pain. He hurts; but he does not know or think that he hurts. The capacities for self-awareness, self-consciousness, and self-ascription arrive with language. Mature human beings can not only express their pain, they can state that they are in pain. And their statements can be true or false. Moreover, Stroud maintains, their self-ascriptions are immediate and direct. Having mastered the relevant concepts, they need not deliberate, assess evidence, or draw inferences. They can simply recognize that an ascription of a feeling to themselves or to another other is correct. Acting intentionally requires knowing what you are doing. So to act intentionally requires self-awareness. And to perceive that someone else is performing a particular intentional act requires ascribing to her a self-awareness of what she is doing. The realism that underwrites perceiving (and thereby knowing) that the apple is red, applies to the ascription of attitudes and intentional actions as well.

Stroud is a realist about colors. He holds that colors are properties of physical objects. They are not dispositional, response dependent, or secondary qualities. We learn color terms by learning which manifest physical objects actually are what color. 'Unmasking and Dispositionalism' is a reply to Johnston (2004). 'Are the Colours of Things Secondary Qualities?' is a reply to McDowell (2011). These papers do not really stand on their own. To understand Stroud's position on color, it is best to go back to his The Quest for Reality: Subjectivism and the Metaphysics of Colour (2000). To understand how he replies to his critics requires going back to Johnston (2004), and McDowell (2011) to see what the criticisms are.

Toward the end of the book there are several papers on Wittgenstein -- primarily but not exclusively on his views about color. They take up the question of how distant someone's views can be from our own without being unintelligible to us. Like Wittgenstein, Stroud believes that understanding a language is always 'from the inside'. That is, we understand a speaker by interpreting her words in terms of words we understand. With this in mind, we can see just how distant Stroud's perspective is from the skeptic's. The skeptic, Stroud argued, wants an outsider's knowledge. She wants to know how, looking at the would-be knower and the facts, we can vindicate the claim that he knows the facts. Stroud thinks that the project, reasonable though it might be, is doomed because the perspective is misguided. There's no hope of knowing from the outside.

Despite the virtues of Stroud's position, I worry that it is too language-centric. It seems to entail that animals without languages are cognitively more impoverished than they seem to be. It is plausible that such animals do not have perceptual knowledge and do not make truth evaluable judgments. But many of them recognize, plan, experience, and attend to critical aspects of their environment. Stroud admits that a rabbit might see a hawk flying in the sky. But the rabbit's seeing the hawk is in important ways not like its seeing a robin. The rabbit is aware that the hawk poses a threat and the robin is harmless. Merely seeing the birds cannot account for this difference. Stroud admits that lions hunt together and that this requires that they triangulate -- that is they orient themselves to one another as well as to their prey (258). This too seems to require some sort of cognizance of their situation -- some sort of awareness not just of p, but that p is q. The behavior of higher animals strongly suggests that not all conceptualization is linguistic.

A similar suggestion derives from aesthetics. Stroud endorses Wittgenstein's claim that 'language could be used to teach someone to play the piano' (236-237; Wittgenstein, 1974, p. 44). I disagree. Although piano teachers are apt to use words in teaching, no one who has ever seriously tried to teach or learn to play the piano would think that language is sufficient to teach someone to play. Words suffice to tell the student to play F# rather than F, but the ability to hit the right notes falls far short of the ability to play the piano. The teacher must convey other, more fine-grained features that are not captured or conveyed by words. The same holds for learning and teaching in the other arts. Arguably, as Wittgenstein maintains, language is our best all-purpose symbol system. But it does not follow that everything that can be captured and conveyed in symbols can be captured and conveyed in linguistic symbols.

I have not been able to do justice to the nuances of Stroud's arguments here. They are worth attending to. There are excellent papers, including one on Kant's transcendental deduction, that I have not even broached. The book is worth studying. It provides readers with the resources to connect the various strands in Stroud's work, to see how and why they fit together.


Johnston, M. 2004. Subjectivism and Unmasking. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69: 187-201.

McDowell, J. 2011. Colours as Secondary Qualities. In J. Bridges, N. Kolodny, W. Wong (eds.) The Possibility of Philosophical Understanding: Reflections on the Thought of Barry Stroud. Oxford University Press, 217-231.

Stroud, B. 2000. The Quest for Reality: Subjectivism and the Metaphysics of Colour. Oxford University Press.

Wittgenstein, L. (1974). Philosophical Grammar (tr. A. Kenny). Blackwell.