Seeing Things as They Are: A Theory of Perception

Placeholder book cover

John Searle, Seeing Things as They Are: A Theory of Perception, Oxford University Press, 2015, 240 pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199385157.

Reviewed by Charles Travis, King's College London


I. Eyes Wide Shut

Pia and Sid sit in La Bellota Hermosa. Across the plate, now empty of presunto, Pia watches Sid, chest becrumbed, reducing a mass of toothpicks to rubble as, slowly and methodically, he works the last strands of fat and sinew out from between his teeth. Pia closes her eyes. It stops. Not the tooth-picking, but the sight of it. From the crevices of such examples John Searle extracts this conclusion: seeing is a subjective experience which takes place within the head (e.g., 17, 52.) Moreover, such experience involves (or consists of) visual consciousness of what occurs in a 'subjective visual field' so that an experience of seeing involves both a subjective and an objective 'visual field'. (3-4) Such is the order of non sequitur characteristic of his new book.

Searle sees the book as falling into three parts. At its core is a 'theory' of perception, sketched in the introduction, further elaborated in chapters 4 and 5, this last 'solving' a series of problems arising only with those core assumptions on which the theory rests. A second part precedes the theory. It is a diagnosis of the (persisting) lure of 'sense-data'. On that diagnosis, the trouble is a specifiable unsound argument. Searle ignores rival diagnoses, notably that of his (late) colleague, Thompson Clarke. Searle's diagnosis matters to his own ends. For, given his own assumptions (or 'theory'), if he is not himself a sense-datum theorist, he is separated from this by a very thin line. His diagnosis is tailored to allow for just that separation (or to try to). Some philosophers, it seems, disclaim commitment to sense data simply on the grounds that they are thoroughly modern (even scientific), whereas (we all know) sense data are from the past. But such disclaimers will not do. The third part of the book takes potshots at some great dark mass of the benighted known to Searle (and sometimes themselves) as 'disjunctivists', a largely anonymous mass but for the beachhead established in Berkeley itself. As with many of disjunctivism's foes, Searle's view of it is gross ignoratio elenchi. It may all the same be that his own unargued assumptions about seeing would rule it out. If so, modus tollens remains very much in the cards. Because disjunctivism chez Searle is not disjunctivism, I will say little more here about his potshots. Rather, I will simply outline, with brief remarks, the core of his own theory -- the bottom of his garden path -- then consider just how close Searle's own view comes to that idea, sense data, on which he heaps abuse.

II. The Elements

Here are some planks in Searle's own view.

First, seeing is a subjective experience taking place within the head. The expression 'in the head' has two familiar readings in philosophy. On one, in the head contrasts with in the environment: those largely spatiotemporal phenomena which it is open for one to encounter (where, for any one, not necessarily that one). On this reading, our brains (the presumed occupants of our skulls) are not in the head. On the other reading, 'in the head' means, literally, in the skull, something intradermal. Our brains are presumably in our heads on this reading. One reason Searle has given for adding 'in the head' to what he extracts from what happens when Pia closes her eyes is that, this being the 21st century, we all realise, or ought to, that experiencing is a biological phenomenon, thus, he takes it, something occurring within the body of an organism. (As said, non sequitur abounds here.) Such suggests the second reading of 'in the head'. But perhaps Searle cannot be held to using the expression in the one way rather than in the other.

Second, visual consciousness is of the contents of a subjective visual field. Searle speaks of an objective visual field. This is, roughly speaking, some region of the environment, namely that region which is visible from where the one doing the viewing stands. It is occupied by whatever occupies that region, for example, by that empty plate, the crumbs on Sid's chest, that pile of demolished toothpicks, certain events of tooth picking. In addition, Searle posits a subjective visual field. What occupies this? Not, he insists, anything visible -- to be seen. Things, though, to be experienced visually, things experienced in visual awareness of the contents of the objective visual field (e.g., 3-4). Frege made the point that you cannot see, hear, or etc., but rather have what he called Vorstellungen -- things one would need to be you to be conscious of, and whose career coincides with your consciousness of them. Here Searle follows suit. You do not see things in your subjective field. But you have them -- experience their so being. Searle calls this 'raw phenomenology'.

A Searlian subjective visual field is not a region of the environment. But it is, as a rule, occupied by objects of awareness, or at least is (for its owner) as though it were. It has spatial dimensions, or is for its owner as though it did. Searle tells us that his "extends, roughly speaking, from the top of my forehead down as low as my chin." (3) Though, he tells us, he is here merely saying "how it seems to me consciously". What occupies it is experienced visually by the field's owner, though not experienceable by one. He writes,

there has to be, for each of the basic perceptual features of objects, a subjective correlate of that basic visual property. This means that in the subjective visual field there must be conscious processes corresponding to color, line, angle, shape, spatial relations, and even temporal relations. (113)

'Relevant processes' are episodes of visual experiencing, whose objects (what are experienced) are not to be found in the environment.

For H.A. Prichard, the occupants of a subjective visual field (the term is not his) are mind-dependent; hence there are no objective facts about them. For Searle things cannot be like that. He needs to be able to think of a given subject's subjective field as being ways which recur, at least in that subject's visual fields being as they are at different points in time. For he needs the following idea: "there is a systematic relation between the property of being F and the property of being able to cause a certain sort of experience." (121) An object's being red or spherical, for example, is systematically related to a certain thing to be experienced visually in a viewer's subjective visual field -- an experience which can thus recur in different viewers, and in the same viewer on different occasions.

Searle now has a thin line to tread. Frege introduces Vorstellungen in arguing that only a shared environment provides things to judge of, things of which there are truths and falsehoods. Prichard follows Frege here; Searle cannot. Whether one can have that first half of Frege without the second is a pressing question for Searle, though unaddressed by him.

Thirdly, for Searle, every visual experience has a content. On one use of 'object', for him, only some have an object. Here an object would be some visible part of the environment. On another use, for him all visual experience does. Here 'object' would be whatever is thus experienced visually (the object of 'experience'). Searle quite properly insists that the content of a visual experience could not be its object: content is not something to be experienced visually. (Frege's point: in representing, something is presented as falling under a given generality. Generalities are not visible.)

Unfortunately, Searle neglects a related distinction: that between what 'see' speaks of in, e.g., 'see the Wildschwein digging up the garden', and what it speaks of in 'see that the Wildschwein is digging up the garden'. One can watch a Wildschwein digging. One cannot watch that a Wildschwein is digging. That it is digging, as opposed to its digging, neither goes on for a long time nor is very brief. Though it may be digging next to the roses, such is not where that it is digging is. Nor is any other spot. That it is digging, unlike its digging, does not form images on retinas, is not seen, does not look any particular way, is not what a visual experience could be of things being (for the viewer) as though . . .

Neglecting these different things 'see' may speak of may make that the pig is digging look like a possible object of sight. Which would cancel Searle's good point that a content cannot be an object of sight. The temptation is there, his will to resist it far from indomitable. Perhaps, e.g., incitement here to his strange and unargued view that whenever someone recognises what he sees as a case of something being thus and so (e.g., a Porsche), such changes how what he sees looks (to him) (e.g., 37).

Fourthly, seeing is intentional. 'Intentional', Searle tells us, is for him a technical term, having nothing to do with any ordinary meaning that English word may have. So we must garner its meaning from his use. One thing he tells us is: "Intentionality is that feature of the mind by which it is directed at, or about, or of objects and states of affairs in the world." (33) One does not 'see at', or 'see about'. Nor 'see of'. One might, of course, see something of the spectacle of Sid dribbling, own-goalwards -- that is, while missing part. But no interesting 'intentionality' is likely to harbour in that use of 'of'. Nor will it help here to ask what one sees to be about or of something. There is nothing that pig is about (except, on one use of 'about', his business, whatever that is). So far, then, seeing would appear to be a paradigm of the non-intentional, whatever the 'intentional' may be.

Searle himself, though, does not put that much faith in prepositions. The main thing for him is that an intentional state has 'satisfaction conditions': conditions on a relevant sort of success or felicity. These, he thinks, an experience of seeing (Sid trying to balance a pea on his fork, say) has. But why would anyone ever think that? In brief, if it is not there, then you did not see it. So how can seeing be done successfully or not? How can it have a condition on success? Which is why it is important to Searle that a case of seeing is also, per se, a case of something else, which might go on whether you were seeing or not: experiencing, visually, such-and-such 'raw phenomenology' in one's 'subjective' visual field. Here is something which may be seeing (that success) or not. ("Perceptual experience is just a raw piece of brute phenomenological data". (135))

Here, anyway, is one reason (among many) for thinking seeing non-intentional (in Searle's sense). Objects of sight belong to history. What one sees (where anything) are (some of) the current goings on in some region of the environment. But history has no generality. It does not (in Frege's terms) generalise beyond itself to a range of cases of being the same on some understanding of 'same' it invokes. It does not present itself as falling under some generality; as being some way there is for things to be. Nor is it some such generality. Whereas a condition on felicity represents things as being a certain way: that way required for satisfying it. The generality it invokes is precisely absent in objects of sight. How can visual awareness (of its objects) attach itself to any given such thing?

 Searle claims, "Perceptual experience . . . is the paradigm of intentionality, and other forms of intentionality -- such as beliefs -- are in large part derived from [it]." (54) Seeing often engenders, or explains, intentional states. Seeing Sid's tooth-picking may make recognisable that someone is picking his teeth. This, or a ringer for it, may make so judging understandable. Seeing Sid is, moreover, what might enable one to think things of him überhaupt. So seeing occasions things intentional. So, Searle finds, it must be intentional. No comment.

Searle remarks:

when I have a visual experience, it seems to me that the world is the way that I am perceiving it as being. . . . the sheer phenomenology, the sheer experiential character of your perceptual experiences, gives you an impression that this is how things are. And that is a sure mark of intentionality. (56)

 Some visual experiences fit some such description. Does such really suggest (Searlian) intentionality? Not without equivocation. Often, when we are seeing, we are fully aware, and take it that such is what we are doing. Seeing is eo ipso awareness of things being as they are, hence of how they are. But for things to be as they are and for them to be thus and so for given substituends for that dummy are two different things. If, in being as they are, things are such that, say, that is a pea on Sid's fork, or a pig on Pia's leash this is because things being as they are is one way for things to count as a case of those ways for things to be; falls under those generalities. If it needed to be thus for some satisfaction condition to be satisfied, then that condition would attach to something intentional in Searle's sense. But seeing how things are in the sense in which seeing would be doing that does not entail seeing that things are any given such ways. So far, there is here at most a grammatical illusion of intentionality.

Searle also remarks, "The fact that the processes in the subjective visual field, the experiences, have intentionality has two important consequences . . . : all seeing is seeing as and all seeing is seeing that." (110) From the start it was intuitively obvious to Searle that all seeing is both of these. That such is entailed by the intentionality of perceptual experience, if so it is, may, perhaps, serve for him as confirmation of such intentionality. As to seeing-that, he says,

the content of perceptual intentionality is always that such and such. So, for example, one never just sees an object. One sees it in front of one -- directly in front or to the left or above or below. In every visual experience some total state of affairs is presented. (110)

 But how is this last an elaboration of his idea that perceptual experience has content? Is the suggestion not just the opposite? As Austin wrote,

Suppose you ask me 'What did you see this morning?' I might answer, 'I saw a man shaved in Oxford.' Or again I might say, no less correctly and referring to the same occasion, 'I saw a man born in Jerusalem.; Does it follow that I must be using 'see in different senses? Of course not. . . . two things are true of the man that I saw -- (a) that he was being shaved in Oxford, and (b) that he had been born some years earlier in Jerusalem. And certainly I can allude to either of these facts about him in saying -- in no way ambiguously -- that I saw him. Or if there is ambiguity here, it is not the word 'saw' that is ambiguous. (1962: 98-99)

If Pia stands before you holding a pig on a leash, then what you see is Pia, before you, holding a pig on a leash. If the pig is a bísaro, then what you in fact see is a bísaro on a leash, even if you mistakenly take it for an Old Spot. You see a whole state of affairs because that is what is there to be seen. Such is seeing where a visual phenomenon. Seeing not only need not be intentional for this, but, if intentionality requires being directed at an object, then such exhibits its intrinsic non-intentionality. Nor does seeing any of these things require, or entail, seeing that things are thus. Searle is simply deaf to grammar.

III. The Big Mistake

This mistake, Searle tells us, is responsible for the idea of sense data. It also, he thinks, explains disjunctivism. These questions (among others) thus arise: What are sense data? Who is committed to them? What is the mistake? Who makes it?

The mistake, Searle thinks, consists in a false premiss in a particular argument he constructs. Thus, sense datum theory rests, for him, on a particular unsound argument. Disjunctivism's (alleged) mistake is to reject a different premiss of that same argument, thus finding unsound what the sense datum theorist finds sound. Same mistake? The real false premiss, Searle tells us, is: "In both the veridical case and the hallucination case we are aware of something (are conscious of something, see something)." (p. 22) What is wrong with this? Searle's first shot: "In the sense in which I am aware of the green table in the veridical perception, in the case of the hallucination, I am not aware of anything." (p. 25) But careful. Such is only one of Searle's readings of 'aware'. On this reading, an object of awareness would be some part of the environment. Searle also sees another reading for 'aware'. For him, on this reading one is also aware of experiencing what one then does 'subjectively'. One is, for example, "having a visual experience which is exactly as if I were seeing San Francisco Bay, etc." (59) For, for him, in an experience of seeing, "we have an ontologically subjective visual experience existing as a 'private' entity in the head of the perceiving agent." (59) And we are aware of this, a 'raw phenomenology' (his term). I stress: what we thus experience must, for Searle, be an object of awareness, since there must be truths about it. For one thing, his account of how 'raw phenomenology' comes by content requires that such things be able to recur. The objects of sight are objects, things for one to encounter (inter alia) in experience. There are no such objects to be objects of 'subjective' experience. Nonetheless, for Searle it has an object, where what it thus has is also an object of awareness.

Sense-datum theorists have often put their conclusion as about what is seen. It is fair to point out that a sense datum, in their sense, could not be something seen. Frege's point exactly. To reject this is to reject that premiss Searle does, read as he does. How far does this take us? A sense-datum theorist approaches the question of what is seen armed with a particular conception of what would answer it. That conception first yields a set of negative results. If we think of the matter as the theorist does, it will become apparent to us, on reflection, that we do not ever see, for example, a duck egg, or an armchair, or a manor house, nor even a bit of surface of any such thing. If the premiss Searle rejects is false, then if we do not see such things, we do not see anything. But a sense-datum theorist might well take this in his stride. 'See', a 'folk' term, he might say, proves not to be the mot juste. There remains, on Searle's account, a perfectly good use of 'aware' on which a sense datum might be an object of visual awareness. To insist that all visual experience has such objects of awareness is to insist on no more than Searle does. Of course, Searle also insists that some visual experience has other sorts of objects, e.g., a duck egg. Sense-datum theorists also have their familiar ways of accommodating such talk. Whether Searle himself has a better way, incompatible with theirs, is debatable.

Searle thinks disjunctivists commit the same error as sense-datum theorists. Such would have to be: thinking The Bad Argument valid. But does either in fact have any view as to that? If Searle is right, the sense-datum theorist also finds it sound, whereas the disjunctivist, if as Searle describes him, finds the argument unsound -- wrongly, by Searle's lights, rejecting a perfectly good premiss: that in both seeing and ringers for it, "there is a common element -- a qualitative subjective experience going on in the visual system [sic]." (22) Why anyone might reject that idea simply escapes him.

IV. Stipulation

Disjunctivism is a thesis about an ingredient there is not in an experience of seeing something. It would, inter alia, reject that premiss Searle does, and the one he accepts as well. Not necessarily because either of these is false, but perhaps rather because neither gets so far as being either true or false. If disjunctivism goes so far, then Searle thinks we can refute it by stipulation (stipulate experiences into existence). He writes,

In philosophy (unlike neuroscience), the idea that there can be hallucinations that have the same phenomenology and the same intentional content as the veridical experience is not a hypothesis, it is a stipulation. We just decide as a thought experiment to stipulate not only that there are hallucinations and veridical experiences that are indiscriminable, but that they are indiscriminable for the reason that they have exactly the same phenomenal features. (167)

A minimal condition on a stipulation is that it must be coherent. Here there are three obvious notions to make sense of: (having) (a) phenomenology, phenomenal feature, and indiscriminable. Searle takes these to be simply unproblematic. He speaks freely of such things as 'raw phenomenology', 'how things seem to the viewer', without a hint of a qualm as to what such things might be. If a person allows himself this much, he might well conclude that disjunctivism is mistaken, with the same entitlement with which he allows himself that much. If such things seem obviously unproblematic, then disjunctivism will also seem mere foolishness. For disjunctivism does worry about such things. For all said so far, they might still be worth worrying about.

Given what Searle finds unproblematic, one might wonder whether he himself is a sense-datum theorist. But there is a problem in making that charge stick. For Searle's use of words, like that of a certain legendary large egg, is mercurial. Searle sees sense-datum theory as the contrary of 'direct realism', which he claims at one point, "just says that you perceive objects directly and not by way of perceiving something else. The visual experience is the content but not the object of perception." (173) It is by this that Searle distances himself from sense data. But is 'the visual experience' (or what is experienced), for Searle, just the content, and not the object, of perception? Searle writes,

it is absolutely essential to be clear about the distinction between content and object. . . . For example, if I see a man in front of me, the content is that there is a man in front of me. The object is the man himself. (35)

the phenomenological features of the subjective visual field determine the conditions of satisfaction of the visual experience (114)

the perceptual experience is just a raw piece of brute phenomenological data and we must characterize the phenomenology in a way that shows how it determines the intentionality. (135)

About one thing Searle is right here. Content, e.g., the sort of success condition that, for Searle, belongs to intentionality, cannot be experienced visually. Neither that things are thus and so, nor the very idea of things so being, are objects of visual awareness, on any reading of 'aware'. For him, the phenomenal features of a subjective visual field cannot be content. On his view they must be, as he acknowledges, something which fixes the (supposed) content of that experience. Of course they are not perceived. But on Searle's view they are experienced visually, in which what is perceived is. Searle is not entitled to claim otherwise -- without, that is, following the example of that famous egg. Otherwise he has no claim to direct realism by his own account of what that is.

Searle writes, "the visual scene includes both the ontologically objective state of affairs perceived and the ontologically subjective experience going on inside your head. I cannot imagine how any sane philosopher can deny the existence of either of these." (54) An experience needs a subject, the experiencer. It needs an object, what is experienced. So much is truism. In an experience of seeing, what is seen is such an object. Experiencing it is itself a phenomenology for an experience to have, already one answer to the question how things were for the perceiver. Sometimes there is more to say than that. But Searle reads much more into the grammatical truism, sees it as per se requiring much more of a 'phenomenology'. Like a sense-datum theorist, he fails to see the options.

V. Schluss

J.L. Austin once gave this reason for attention to how words actually work: that the distinctions language has been forced to recognise are likely more illuminating than any a philosopher may think up in his armchair of an afternoon. (1956: 182) Language, from this perspective, is a starting point for philosophy, though, as Austin also stressed, not the end of its ambitions. Searle prefers the armchair. Its advantage is free rein to fancy. Its real risk, with the snares language sets, is dejà vu all over again.


Austin, J.L., 1956: "A Plea For Excuses", in Philosophical Papers, vol. 3, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979, 175-204.

_____, 1962: Sense and Sensibilia, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1962.

Frege, Gottlob, 1918: "Der Gedanke", Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus, v. 1, n, 2, 1918, 58-77.