Seeking Nature's Logic: Natural Philosophy in the Scottish Enlightenment

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David B. Wilson, Seeking Nature's Logic: Natural Philosophy in the Scottish Enlightenment, Penn State UP, 2009, 344pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780271033600.

Reviewed by Paul Wood, University of Victoria, Canada



In Seeking Nature’s Logic David Wilson tells the story of the development of natural philosophy in Scotland from roughly 1690 to 1810. After summarizing the rival systems of Descartes, Leibniz, and Newton, Wilson charts the emergence of various forms of Newtonianism in Scotland during the first half of the eighteenth century. Having thereby established the intellectual context for the pursuit of natural knowledge in the Scottish Enlightenment, he turns to the lectures and writings of the leading men of science affiliated with the University of Glasgow in the years spanning 1740 to 1760. He next moves north to Aberdeen to track the rise of Common Sense philosophy before returning to Glasgow to discuss the interplay of chemical inquiry and natural philosophical speculation in the work of Joseph Black and his disciples. In the following chapter he analyses Black’s Glasgow colleague John Anderson’s idiosyncratic blend of “Newtonian realism”, natural history, and Christian apologetics. The geographical focus of the book then switches to Edinburgh for the last three chapters. Here he explores the twists and turns in the thinking of John Robison, whom he regards as Scotland’s most distinguished eighteenth-century man of science. Wilson ends by identifying the conceptual shifts that occurred in the teaching of natural philosophy at the University of Edinburgh after Robison’s death in 1805.

Although the scope of Seeking Nature’s Logic might initially seem to be limited, it would be a mistake to think that this book is of merely parochial interest. One need not accept the claim that the Scots invented the modern world in order to recognize that Scotland played a leading role in the Enlightenment of the eighteenth-century Atlantic world and that her medics, mathematicians, moralists, and naturalists were often at the forefront of theoretical developments in the human and natural sciences during this period. We should not lose sight of the fact that Wilson’s story is not simply about Scotland, insofar as it is part of a broader narrative of the significant changes that took place within natural philosophy in the wake of the Scientific Revolution. And even though he says little about this broader narrative, there is no doubt about the historical importance of his study, for he sees John Robison as a pivotal figure in the history of physics. Because Robison was “the main conceptual link between Newton and those Scottish geniuses of Victorian physics, Lord Kelvin and James Clerk Maxwell” (p. xi), Wilson goes so far as to assert that “this book tells the untold story of the principal historical path from Isaac Newton to Albert Einstein” (p. xii).

Whatever we might make of this assertion, Seeking Nature’s Logic will undoubtedly be required reading for anyone interested in the cultivation of what we now call “science” and “philosophy” in the eighteenth century. Given the extensive literature on science and medicine in the Scottish Enlightenment that has accumulated since the 1970s, it is surprising that Wilson’s study is the first monograph devoted specifically to delineating the various strands of natural philosophy woven together by the Scots from the work of Newton as well as continental thinkers like Herman Boerhaave, Georg Ernst Stahl, and Roger Joseph Boscovich. Aspects of the topic were initially explored in Richard Olson’s Scottish Philosophy and British Physics, 1750-1880 and Arthur Donovan’s Philosophical Chemistry in the Scottish Enlightenment (both of which appeared in 1975). But Seeking Nature’s Logic is the first extended treatment of the ways in which Scottish natural philosophers conceptualized the economy of nature during the course of the eighteenth century. Wilson’s book builds on those earlier studies, even if he does not always accept their interpretation of the material that he covers. And in a number of respects he moves beyond Olson and Donovan by enriching our understanding of science in the Scottish Enlightenment.

First, Wilson’s cast of characters is more inclusive. For he both highlights the achievements of leading men of science like Black and Robison and rescues the reputations of a host of lesser figures. Especially welcome is the extended discussion of the evolution of the lecture courses given by John Anderson during his long tenure as the Glasgow Professor of Natural Philosophy. Scholarly commentary on Anderson has thus far not dealt systematically with his scientific interests, so that Wilson’s detailed examination of Anderson’s natural philosophy significantly advances our knowledge. Moreover, it is important to know more about the theories of many of the minor naturalists that populate the pages of this book. Thanks to Wilson we now have a broader sense of the range of ideas debated within the Scottish scientific community during the eighteenth century and are thus better placed to map the social and intellectual networks that sustained natural philosophical enquiry in the period.

Secondly, Wilson’s narrative is based on a thorough examination of the relevant manuscript and print sources. Since the 1970s scholars have been increasingly assiduous in their mining of the archives. Wilson’s book reflects this trend. The bibliography of Seeking Nature’s Logic attests to long hours spent poring over university records, letters, lecture notes, and manuscripts to fill in the picture of eighteenth-century Scottish natural philosophy found in the many pamphlets and books he has consulted. Particularly noteworthy is his meticulous use of ten sets of student lecture notes to reconstruct the theoretical shifts in Black’s chemistry and his ability to decipher and make sense of the forty volumes of Robison’s lecture notes for his natural philosophy course that survive in Edinburgh University Library. While there are a number of insightful studies of Black’s chemistry, Wilson’s chapter is among the best because he is one of the few scholars to examine thoroughly the archival sources. Moreover, there is simply nothing in the literature to rival Wilson’s account of Robison’s chemistry and natural philosophy lectures. Seeking Nature’s Logic will therefore be the standard reference work for anyone wanting to understand the scientific work of Black and especially of Robison.

Thirdly, Wilson makes a persuasive case for seeing chemistry as constituting the heart of natural philosophy in Enlightenment Scotland. Wilson develops Arthur Donovan’s argument that the brand of “philosophical chemistry” promoted by Black and his teacher William Cullen formed the core of Scottish natural philosophy from the 1750s until the 1780s, when the Scots were forced to grapple with Lavoisier’s revolutionary chemical system. Central to this natural philosophy was a preoccupation with the nature of heat, which the Scots typically explained in terms of a subtle fluid variously identified as an ethereal medium or as fire. In positing the existence of such a fluid Scottish men of science were, in turn, led to investigate the relationship between heat and other phenomena studied in the sciences of chemistry, optics, electricity, and magnetism which had likewise prompted some to postulate the existence of ethers and fluids to account for what could be perceived at the macroscopic level. There thus emerged a conception of what Wilson calls “nature’s hidden realm” that was framed in terms of the operations of unobservable media, and it was this conception which he claims dominated Scottish natural philosophy from roughly 1760 to the turn of the nineteenth century. While Donovan and others have already sketched out the basic outlines of this interpretation of Scottish natural philosophy, Wilson adds pertinent new details drawn from his extensive archival research and reshapes the narrative by both extending it chronologically and including figures who had previously been excluded from the story. Consequently, even if Wilson’s characterization of natural philosophy in the Scottish Enlightenment is not entirely original it is nevertheless the most comprehensive yet to appear in the scholarly literature.

However, the book’s many strengths are somewhat compromised by various weaknesses. Wilson rarely engages with broader historiographical debates which makes Seeking Nature’s Logic more intellectually introverted than it need be. For example, beneath the book’s deceptively bland subtitle, “Natural Philosophy in the Scottish Enlightenment”, lies a hidden historiographical minefield. The term “the Scottish Enlightenment” was apparently first coined in William Robert Scott’s Francis Hutcheson: His Life, Teaching and Position in the History of Philosophy (1900). Scott used the term to explicate Hutcheson’s historical significance and, for him, “the Scottish Enlightenment” was a phenomena defined exclusively in terms of “philosophy” understood in the modern sense of the term. One school of historians follows Scott in seeing natural philosophy as being peripheral to the core concerns of the Scottish Enlightenment. Their characterization has, in turn, been challenged by scholars such as Roger Emerson who have argued that the natural sciences and medicine were integral to Scottish ideals of Enlightenment and improvement. In terms of this on-going disagreement readers of Seeking Nature’s Logic will be left puzzled as to the precise meaning of the subtitle’s “in”. Presumably Wilson means more than simply “Scottish natural philosophy from 1690 to 1810”, with 1690 and 1810 taken as the approximate beginning and end dates of the Scottish Enlightenment. But if “in” is meant in a cognitive rather than merely a chronological sense, it is unclear what role Wilson assigns to natural philosophy in the making of the Scottish Enlightenment and hence exactly where he stands in this scholarly debate.

Furthermore, the notion of distinctive national forms of Enlightenment has recently come under increased scrutiny. Hence one might reasonably ask what was distinctively Scottish about “the Scottish Enlightenment”? Although Wilson takes no explicit stance on this issue he does state that Robison “articulat[ed] a particularly Scottish approach to physics” without elaborating on the point (p. xi). His comment prompts various questions regarding the specifically Scottish character of Robison’s natural philosophy. Was it the preoccupation with the nature of heat inherited from Cullen and Black that made it uniquely Scottish? One brief prefatory remark (p. xii) implies that Wilson might endorse the affirmative response given by Donovan and other historians of Scottish chemistry but there is no unequivocal answer to be found elsewhere in the book. Was it the postulation of the existence of various subtle fluids or the use of Boscovich’s ideas? One of the major frustrations with Seeking Nature’s Logic is that Wilson gives us little sense of how Scottish natural philosophy registered broader European developments during the middle decades of the eighteenth century. He provides a fascinating picture of Scottish reactions to Lavoisier, while leaving us largely in the dark about English or continental natural philosophy in the period leading up to the Chemical Revolution. Older studies such as Robert E. Schofield’s Mechanism and Materialism: British Natural Philosophy in the Age of Reason (1970) suggest that Scottish natural philosophers were no different from men of science elsewhere in their speculations about ethers and fluids or their interest in Boscovichean point atoms. Unfortunately Wilson gives no insight into how he thinks the work of natural philosophers in Scotland related to that of their colleagues across the Atlantic world in the mid-eighteenth century, and without such a comparison we cannot determine what, if anything, was characteristically Scottish about Robison’s natural philosophy.

Wilson’s treatment of Robison also poses a question about the role of mathematics in Scottish natural philosophy. The chapters devoted to Robison in Seeking Nature’s Logic ignore the fact that his Edinburgh lectures were notoriously difficult because he expected a high degree of numeracy on the part of his students. Robison believed that the book of nature was written in the language of mathematics and his quantitative style of natural philosophy contrasted sharply with the largely qualitative style adopted by virtually every other eighteenth-century Scottish professor of natural philosophy (the exception being Colin Maclaurin, who gets short shrift in this book). Thus even though Wilson says many perceptive things about Robison, his account seems skewed because he does not sufficiently discuss how Robison’s approach to natural philosophy was rooted in Newton’s Principia Mathematica. Moreover, if one neglects this salient feature of Robison’s scientific work then it is difficult to assess where Robison stood in relation to the fundamental changes that occurred at the turn of the nineteenth century identified by Thomas Kuhn and others as constituting a “Second Scientific Revolution”. For Kuhn, this Revolution centred on “the remarkably rapid and full mathematization” of the sciences of heat, electricity, magnetism, and light, that is, the fields in which Robison applied rigorous quantitative reasoning like that found in Newton’s Principia.1 Consequently, Wilson leaves the “untold story” of how physics evolved from Newton through Robison to Einstein still largely untold because he omits the feature of Robison’s natural philosophy that is central to that story, namely the mathematization of nature.

Inspired by George Davie’s The Democratic Intellect (1961) historians have long been interested in the influence of Common Sense philosophy on Scottish science during the eighteenth century and beyond. Wilson is evidently dissatisfied with previous treatments of the topic because he states in his preface that the question of Reid’s influence on Scottish natural philosophy is a “key and heretofore unanswered” one (p. xii). I take it that what he really means is that while there have been answers, he considers those given by Davie, Olson, and others as being inadequate. Wilson’s handling of the question marks something of an improvement over the earlier literature on the topic, although I find his chapter dealing with Common Sense philosophy to be the least persuasive in the book. For one thing, his mastery over the material covered here is less secure. There are some obvious slips (he gives the wrong names for George Campbell and James Beattie on p. 105), and it is noticeable that he does not as elsewhere draw on unpublished archival sources. This is especially problematic in the context of interpreting the work of Thomas Reid, whose Inquiry and two Essays give only a limited sense of the full range of his intellectual interests. Reid’s manuscripts and related archival materials tell us, for example, that contrary to Wilson’s claim that Common Sense philosophy “emerged from the Aberdeen Philosophical Society around 1760” (p. 105), the origins of the Common Sense “school” lie in the late 1740s when Reid, Campbell and Alexander Gerard first began to associate with one another. Reid and Gerard went on to articulate their philosophical doctrines in their lectures at the two Aberdeen colleges in the 1750s before the founding of the Society in 1758. Beattie played no role in the initial development of Common Sense philosophy and, notwithstanding his later popularity as a writer, it is thus not clear why he merits discussion in this chapter rather than Gerard.

Reid’s unpublished papers also tell us that he was as accomplished a mathematician and natural philosopher as he was an epistemologist and moralist. Consequently, Wilson’s presentation of Reid as a “philosopher” in the modern sense of the term is problematic. One would not know from reading Seeking Nature’s Logic that Reid was a gifted mathematician or that he collaborated extensively with his scientific colleagues at the University of Glasgow after his move there in 1764. From the 1740s onwards Reid was a recognized member of the Scottish scientific community and he therefore merits a place in Wilson’s book as a natural philosopher and not just as a “philosopher” who happened to influence men of science in Scotland. Wilson here reverts to the stereotypical image of Reid first created by Dugald Stewart, but a number of scholars have recently shown that this image is no longer credible. Furthermore, Reid’s unpublished papers indicate that he was far more open to theorizing about “nature’s hidden realm” than Wilson allows. On Wilson’s reading of Reid’s published work, Reid was the arch anti-hypotheticalist who eschewed speculations about unobservables on the ground that such speculations were typically unsubstantiated conjectures based on loose analogies and insufficient empirical evidence. I have argued that even though Reid attacked the use of hypotheses, his unpublished scientific manuscripts show that he apparently accepted the existence of minute particles of light and both an electrical and a caloric fluid.2 Because Wilson has not delved into Reid’s unpublished papers he does not, in my view, have the full measure of the complexities of Reid’s thought and hence is unable to gauge Reid’s influence on Robison and other Scottish natural philosophers.

Although Seeking Nature’s Logic does not entirely live up to its promise for the reasons I have indicated, it nevertheless provides a much needed and, on the whole, reliable guide to eighteenth-century Scottish natural philosophy that will undoubtedly inform future research in the field. On the basis of the book we can begin to understand more fully the ways in which natural knowledge was “in” the Scottish Enlightenment. Hopefully, Wilson’s treatment of Reid and his fellow Common Sense philosophers will also prompt a systematic reassessment of the interplay of natural and moral philosophy in the period. It is a measure of Wilson’s achievement to say that Seeking Nature’s Logic will be a starting point for anyone wanting to think through such issues and not just in the Scottish context.

1 Thomas S. Kuhn, “Mathematical versus Experimental Traditions in the Development of Physical Science”, in The Essential Tension: Selected Studies in Scientific Tradition and Change (Chicago and London, 1977), pp. 31-65 (p. 61).

2 Paul Wood, “Thomas Reid and the Culture of Science”, in Terence Cuneo and René van Woudenberg (eds), The Cambridge Companion to Thomas Reid (Cambridge, 2004), pp. 53-76.