Selected Essays

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Félix Ravaisson, Selected Essays, Mark Sinclair (ed.), Bloomsbury, 2016, 360pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472574879.

Reviewed by Michael E. Moore, University of Iowa


With the publication of this volume, the availability of Ravaisson's highly original writing is vastly expanded for readers of English. In fact, some of the essays included have been scarce, little-known, or difficult to obtain even in the original French editions (i.e. expensive and fragile). Included, too, is the essay "Of Habit", a translation of which was published by Bloomsbury in 2008, but which is now presented in a revised edition. Heretofore this was the only work of Ravaisson available in English. "Of Habit" has had a potent impact, bringing Ravaisson to the attention of classicists, art critics, and philosophers, certainly justifying the further publication of this large, handsomely produced collection.

Jean-Gaspard-Félix Laché Ravaisson-Mollien was born in 1813, and died at century's end. The brilliant small treatise "Of Habit" was Ravaisson's dissertation, which he defended in 1837 before a puzzled and displeased professor. Editor Mark Sinclair rightly defines this work as "poetic and oracular." Ravaisson's classical and philosophical training, and the somewhat unusual course of his career, developed over the next decades. Going on to become a prominent educator and official, rather than an academic, he helped shape the curriculum in French schools in the areas of art instruction and philosophy. In 1870 he was appointed by Napoleon III as Curator of Classical Antiquities in the Louvre Museum. From this prestigious position his varied talents and interests came together as he restored, preserved and reinterpreted various works of ancient Greek and Roman art, most notably the Venus de Milo.

Ravaisson was a friend of Jules Michelet (1798-1874), and was much influenced by the philosophy of Friedrich Schelling (1775-1854). Moreover, it is worth pausing to see him as a contemporary of the composers César Franck and Claude Débussy, and the poets Paul Verlaine and Stéphane Mallarmé, who deserve mention here, because a similar atmosphere of vague beauty, ancient solemnity, and tragic pensiveness can be detected in the writings of Ravaisson, despite their scientific rigor, philological erudition, and philosophical clarity: Ravaisson contributed to the modern, sensitive, classicality of late-nineteenth-century French culture. He was moreover a highly practical and dedicated administrator.

When the Prussians defeated the French army and marched on Paris in 1870, Ravaisson oversaw the disassembly, frantic packing and shipping of masterpieces out of the Louvre, to prevent their being destroyed or looted. Sinclair provides a thrilling account of Ravaisson's involvement in those efforts, which later culminated in the momentous uncrating of the Venus de Milo, after the smoke had cleared, following the disastrous suppression of the French Commune. The vicissitudes to which the statue had been subjected now became for the scholar Ravaisson an opportunity to return the statue to a more appropriate orientation and posture, restoring its original meaning in the context of ancient art, and reversing the ill-effects of poorly informed and badly executed early restorations, which Ravaisson denounced in no uncertain terms as the result of "profound decadence" (both ancient and modern!).

I will not attempt to summarize, one at a time, all these profound and fascinating texts, which would be stultifying, since the reader will want to explore them on her own in any case. What follows is rather a presentation of some unifying themes from across the contents of the volume, which, I hope, will provide some insight into Ravaisson's methods and scholarly passions. Late in life, Ravaisson composed a "Philosophical Testament" in which he tried to get off his chest various ultimate statements after a lifetime of thought. In the "Testament" he returned to some key ideas first developed in his early essay on habit. Reacting against what he saw as the prominence of nihilism and "smallness" in contemporary philosophy, Ravaisson reflected on his lifelong, profound immersion in ancient philosophy, especially the philosophy of Aristotle. Among modern philosophers he most often returned to Leibniz, whom he adored because the German philosopher well understood the depths of consciousness. The "second nature" of habit, Ravaisson explained once again, helps us to understand the nature of life itself, because through the effect of habit, the opposition of subject and object is gradually effaced, or "replaced by absolute immediacy." The mind, in effect, deploys itself in the body, enters into its workings, guides it, and gradually merges with it. Thus the idea enters into the physical, the spiritual becomes material -- the traditional two orders of being are thereby bridged. If we consider the case of the long-distance runner, the thousand-fold motion of his legs is gradually less and less observed, as the body absorbs the idea and desire of the goal, through the beneficent processes of habit. In "Of Habit", Ravaisson had analysed in detail the many ramifications of such phenomena.

These innermost movements within nature and humanity follow a pattern already understood by artists of the Renaissance. Michelangelo intuited that the ultimate pattern of transfer from spirit to matter was a serpentine movement that recurs in all beautiful works of art. Leonardo da Vinci thought likewise. Like the process of habit, the undulating serpentine motion is a phenomenon bridging the realms of being, the spiritual and the physical, which can be grasped and distilled in the making of beautiful art. Thus the painter can portray the inner life of the spirit, capturing the glance and posture of emotions or thoughts. The theme of beauty takes us back to the origins of art, when archaic humanity attempted to hold on to the beauty that had been revealed to it in some theophany, taking the form of "a mystery that has its own form of initiation." Stones were lifted and carved to express this. Thus in origin, art is initiatory, a religious mystery, which is why great art has always attempted to grasp the whole rather than clutching at details. The religious mysteries of early humankind, and the art created in response to their religious experiences, offered access to the primary structures of reality. For Ravaisson, study of the arts, study of antiquity, the history of religion, and the practice of philosophy were thoroughly intertwined as different approaches to the same fundamental problems. As he explained in "The Art of Drawing according to Leonardo da Vinci", the main concept is to see art as a form of knowledge, because "art teaches us to know [the things of the world] better." Moreover, through artistic exploration, the true character of things comes to light: "it is spirit that art has the task of expressing." The word 'Spirit', understood in a subtle, artistic sense, often flowed from Ravaisson's pen. In his summary of the state of nineteenth century philosophy, he thought he could discern the dawning of a new philosophical return to the spirit (inspired by the impact of Schelling).

Similarly, in "On the Teaching of Drawing", Ravaisson recoiled from the standard practice of teaching students to analyze, decompose their object and think of it terms of geometric shapes. Anyone who has had the misfortune of being taught by this method will recall the absurd similarity of such sketches to balloon animals. The arm of a person or the leg of a horse becomes a meaningless series of descending cones. Instead, Ravaisson taught, the student should observe as many great works of art as possible, and learn to keep in mind the original whole of the entity she hopes to portray. The eye does not calculate, but rather it gains the point through intuition. "The beauty of forms, Plotinus said, does not consist in proportions (as others believed), but in something that hovers above them like light from above; and this something, we will add, is grace." Against the positivism and materialism of standard schools of art, the best way to learn how to draw is to carefully examine harmonious, beautiful items. Ravaisson conceived of grace as the highest form of artistic accomplishment. He associated it with the Greeks, and it guided his work as curator of the Louvre antiquities. Grace is another key concept in the thought of Ravaisson.

In "Essay on Stoicism", Ravaisson scoured a vast terrain of ancient literary sources to bring to life one of the important philosophies of the ancient world. A sense of dread pervaded religious life in antiquity: the world was full of omens, it was something ominous, but Stoicism showed a way out of this fearful impasse. The Stoic adopted a life of discipline and tension, and learned that nature lives not under the arbitrary rule of self-willed gods, but rather the reign of reason itself. The stars move in response to a "primordial art" in which supreme reason can be detected. There on high, we see the Heraclitean fire that pervades all things. Stoicism returned humanity, according to Ravaisson, to an understanding of beauty. "Nothing is good but the beautiful," he explains, and again: "the beautiful and the good are one." The Stoic sage came to understand that the world is subject to a "grand order, a harmonious system." Ravaisson clearly sympathized with that world-view.

Most captivating and impressive of all is Ravaisson's "The Venus de Milo", which will frustrate and confuse its readers until, as a group of philosophical and religious ideas wash over them again and again, like the recurring themes of symphonic music, they take hold of one's imagination and spirit. In the end the essay becomes profoundly convincing, just as the summation of a symphonic work brings many contending themes into a realization of meaning and completeness. Ravaisson's work as a curator in charge of restoring the Venus de Milo was an opportunity for his philology, his philosophy, and his knowledge of the history of ancient art and religion to come together.

Perhaps the central perception of this essay is that ancient norms of beauty were established in the "century of Pericles." The figure of Venus was more important to the ancient world of thought than modern man has realized. The early restorers of the Venus de Milo had seen in her an impressive but masculine vigor. But as Cicero explained, such female figures should possess an ultimate kind of grace and charm: "Venusity." The greatest articulation of Venusity was achieved by Praxiteles in the Aphrodite of Knidos. The form of the goddess was then at its pinnacle of expression because Praxiteles endowed it with the avertens movement, turning away -- in the act of hiding herself the goddess arrives at the moment of grace. "In the movement by which she turns away and hides herself there unfolds the grace -- more beautiful than beauty itself, as another poet said -- that is the attribute proper to Venus." By reorienting the statue after the Prussian invasion, Ravaisson hoped to restore this attitude, the serpentine movement.

To explain his point of view, and to account for his reorientation of the statue, Ravaisson discusses the mythological associations and the archaic background, of the union of Mars and Venus. Together these gods represented "the two contrary powers . . . the one being the cause of division, the other of union." Mars was the divider, the fighter. Venus was the unifier, the lover. Mars carried weapons, while Venus held out a dove. In its original setting, the Venus de Milo lightly placed her hand on the shoulder of a male warrior -- Theseus, the hero of Athens -- who was being recognized thereby as a Mars-like god. We can see this scene correctly only if we understand that Venus was conceived of as a sovereign, majestic figure, "if we see in her, as did high antiquity, a sovereign obeyed by the whole world."

On the basis of his acute philological observations, Ravaisson goes on to present the dream-like image of a temple to Celestial Venus in the Gardens of Athens, where in the nearby Lyceum the youth of Athens were educated. These same youth (as evoked in the poetry of Verlaine, or the music of Debussy) might have bathed in the nearby waters of the Ilyssus, not far from the tombs and monuments celebrating the venerated history of Athens. This is where the original model of the Venus de Milo, the statue known as the "Venus of the Gardens," by Phidias, could still be seen, the Ur-Venus. Phidias was an artistic master, who "must have united to the nobility characterizing all of his works a great degree of grace." So we return to the theme of grace. "Greek artists always sought out grace." The Venus de Milo, Ravaisson concludes, was a hellenistic copy of this ancient lost work. The age of Alexander copied a model from the age of Pericles, and thus preserved an enduring, beautiful image of Venus, "the mistress of the world by her gentleness alone."

By reintroducing Ravaisson in such a grand collection, this publication may even rekindle interest in certain lost concepts: the spirit, grace, and artistic beauty. The book may also assist in a renewed conversation among the fields of philology, art history, philosophy, and the history of religions. In the remarkable essay "Mysteries: Fragments of a Study of the History of Religions", Ravaisson countered the positivistic, modern view that religion arose out of ancient fears in a world that was dangerous, but poorly understood. Instead, the ancients wanted to recognize the constant upwelling of reality out of a good, if mysterious source. The ancient liturgy was "a great concert of admiration and recognition." An atmosphere of secrecy and silence prevailed in the mystery religions, but their devotees hoped to become friends of the gods. The same impulses flowed into Judaism and Christianity, which both desired an "intimate union with the divine essence." Ravaisson believed that the ultimate religious concepts of the mystery religions were found in "a depth of luminous shadows." These discussions, retrieved out of an antiquity much closer to us than that of ancient Athens, yet still mysterious -- I mean the nineteenth century -- may even encourage the return of religion as a theoretical and historical category.