Selected Philosophical Letters

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Brad Inwood, Seneca: Selected Philosophical Letters, Oxford University Press, 2007, 409pp., $81.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198238942.

Reviewed by Katja Maria Vogt, Columbia University


Inwood offers far more than masterful translations of some of the philosophically most difficult Senecan letters (58, 65, 66, 71, 77, 106, 113, 117, 118-124). He also writes a passionate defense of Seneca as a philosopher. The book thus has several sides to it: it provides much needed, modern translations of the highest quality, detailed and utterly helpful commentary, and an on-going argument against the view that Seneca is 'merely' a spiritual guide. Inwood is, as he puts it, "wary" of this view (xviii); to him, it underestimates Seneca as a philosopher. Those who turn to Seneca for the beauty of his Latin, or because they admire his versatility and breadth, may be surprised at the way in which this contention runs through Inwood's book.

What is at stake here? Among contemporary philosophers, Seneca's work elicits for the most part two kinds of responses. Some scholars hold that, as much as we would like to leave prejudices about the superiority of Greek over Roman philosophy behind, Seneca simply is not a rigorous philosopher. Other scholars applaud what they see as Seneca's focus on self-improvement and the therapeutic or spiritual role of philosophy. To them, complaints about Seneca's lack of philosophical rigor are misguided. Such complaints are blind to the fact that, presumably, Seneca conceives of philosophy in a deeply different way -- a way that is in fact attractive, because it places philosophy squarely within the attempt to lead a good life.

Ilsetraut Hadot (1969, Seneca und die griechisch-römische Tradition der Seelenleitung) and John Cooper (2004, "Moral Theory and Moral Improvement: Seneca") combine aspects of both of these reactions. Suppose we are open to acknowledging that Seneca's therapeutical philosophy offers one interesting conception of philosophy among others. This being granted, we can still raise the question of whether a Stoic (i.e., someone who holds the central Stoic tenets, as Seneca does) can consistently take on the role of spiritual guide. As Hadot and Cooper explain, this is a difficult question. For it is key to Stoic philosophy that our lives can only be improved through knowledge; we need arguments for views that we are to adopt. The Stoics hold a different psychological theory from Plato and Aristotle: there is no desiderative faculty of the soul, and therefore no part of it that could be habituated or trained. The soul is reason, and the only way to improve the state of one's soul is to acquire knowledge. Therapeutical writing does not offer sober argument. Rather, it admonishes, evokes vivid images, and suggests exercises for self-improvement. Does therapeutical philosophizing address faculties of the soul which, according to the Stoics, we do not have? Further, the Stoic view that in order to lead good lives we need knowledge, refers to all knowledge (logic, ethics, physics). A dismissive attitude toward logic and the more technical aspects of physics and ontology might be in conflict with a key premise of Stoicism.

Inwood is exhausted with the picture of Seneca as spiritual guide, but not because he does not acknowledge that there could be more than one way of doing philosophy. What Inwood objects to is the suggestion that, insofar as Seneca is a spiritual guide, he lacks understanding of fundamental Stoic premises, and thus fails to fully comprehend his own position. According to Inwood, one should not identify the therapeutic mode of Seneca's writing with his philosophical motivations. Seneca may assume the voice of a spiritual guide, and still ultimately care for the answer to a rather technical philosophical question. As evidence of this, Inwood points to a pattern that runs through a number of Senecan letters. Seneca first discusses some relatively technical issues, and then blames himself for his indulgence in abstract theorizing; or he first engages in philosophical discussion of an abstract issue, and then raises the question of what practical benefit these discussions might have. Based on such considerations, Inwood ascribes to Seneca a "flagrantly ambivalent attitude towards philosophical detail and technicality" (xvii). The structure of Seneca's letters is indeed striking, and I think that Inwood is persuasive in highlighting Seneca's ambivalence. Seneca does not merely dismiss Stoic technicalities. Oftentimes, he first discusses them. However, it is not clear to me that Inwood offers an answer to the worry that therapeutic-spiritual philosophizing seems at odds with Stoic views about reason, virtue, and knowledge, the premises of which most scholars think Seneca adopts. Further, Inwood's own estimation of Seneca's philosophizing, given his overall argument, is surprisingly tentative. Inwood suggests that Seneca is a "man of letters" (xviii). As Inwood puts it, Seneca is able to handle technical matters "reasonably well" (290).

But whether or not Inwood can ultimately dispel concerns about a lack of rigor in Seneca's philosophy, he certainly gives his readers excellent tools to engage with some of Seneca's most technical philosophical writings. Through his translations, Inwood helps us appreciate Seneca as a philosopher: his language is first and foremost precise. Inwood never renders Seneca's admonitions in the grandiose and uplifting tone that older translations of the Letters tended to adopt, and his way of hitting the right note is not limited to the more strictly philosophical passages. Even where Seneca quotes Vergil, an author whose artful brevity is notoriously difficult to capture, Inwood mirrors the lucidity of the original, which makes his text overall utterly readable.

The commentary on each group of letters is prefaced by a survey of the history of scholarly engagement with Seneca's letters. A philosophical commentary to Seneca's philosophical letters must engage with Seneca's references to earlier philosophical theories, and the framework of earlier philosophy that informs Seneca's writing. This is a difficult task. Given how pervasive these references are, such commentary easily becomes source-criticism, and thereby loses sight of the letters as units, a danger that Inwood explicitly warns against. Inwood supplies all the background that is needed, without ever digressing. What is more, he does an impressive job of formulating the philosophical questions that stand behind a certain passage in Seneca in a readily comprehensible fashion, even if we are concerned with such complicated issues as Aristotle's categories, the historical development of Platonic metaphysics, or Heraclitean flux. On the whole, Inwood's commentary provides an impressive mix of philological detail (such as alternative translations, discussion of different manuscripts, and so on), and lays the groundwork for philosophical engagement with the particular topic at hand.

Inwood's commentary both sheds light on key theoretical contentions and elucidates Seneca's metaphors. For example, Letter 71 begins with two points that are at the core of Stoic ethics. What is to be done needs to be determined in the immediate present. It is so much a matter of the present circumstances that advice, traveling to the advisee by mail, will inevitably have lost its grip once the letter is being read (71.1). But reasoning about what is to be done should also not get lost in the details of the given occasion. We need to keep our eye on the target: virtue, the highest good (71.2-3). Inwood highlights these two points, and he cites the key references to the famous image of the archer aiming for a target. In particular, he points out that Seneca's use of the metaphor is not identical to any of the other uses we know of, but notes that Seneca might have had Cicero's image of the archer in De fin 3.22 in mind.

At this point, as at some others, Inwood's readers might find themselves a little torn. Inwood must be applauded for never digressing, and covering an enormous range of material in his commentaries. And still, one may wish that at times his commentary would go further, and explain more fully what the upshot of a given point in Seneca is. For once we try to spell out what precisely the difference between Cicero's and Seneca's use of the metaphor is, we may come to take Seneca's account philosophically very seriously. In Cicero, the metaphor aims to capture the relationship between the valuable (health, life, etc.) and the good (virtue) as the Stoics conceive of it: we should do our best at aiming for the valuable things, and still not care whether we hit the target. Perfect reasoning is based on a full understanding of the value of health, wealth, etc., to a natural life of human beings; but it does not view health, wealth, etc., as good. The natural things are to be selected, not to be desired; only the good is to be desired. This idea is at the heart of Stoic ethics, and the subject of many texts. However, the metaphor of the archer, as it is presented in Cicero, continues to perplex scholars. Is it plausible that archers do not care whether they hit the target?

According to Seneca, the image of aiming at a target is not about the difference between the valuable and the good. It is about the way in which knowing that virtue is the only good shapes deliberation. Deliberation must look at many aspects of a situation, but it should not get lost in the details. This is indeed a key question that virtue ethics must address: if virtuous action is the action of the virtuous person, and the virtuous person has the ability to assess given situations so that she knows what is to be done, we need an account of how she takes in all relevant features of a situation without getting lost in them. According to Seneca, if we keep our eye on the target, namely virtue, this organizes our thought about the details. The way in which the virtuous agent correctly assesses the features of a situation is, for Seneca, informed by knowledge about the good. This proposal might appear very interesting, perhaps in particular when we think about Stoic ethics as a rival of Aristotelian ethics (and compare Seneca's use of the metaphor to EN I.2, 1094a22-24, which Inwood points to).

Let me turn to Inwood's commentaries on those letters that engage with physical and metaphysical (or ontological) topics. According to Inwood, Seneca's contribution to these fields of Stoic philosophy has been misunderstood by other scholars (xxiii) -- it is here that the question about Seneca's interest in more technical philosophical matters becomes most pertinent. Letter 58 can be read as a key text on Stoic ontology, but it is a highly confusing text. Seneca pursues a complex strategy. He wants a number of things: to argue for the coinage of certain Latin terms that are central to Platonic and Aristotelian metaphysics; to side with a modified Stoic ontology; to explain the benefits of ontology as a philosophical discipline; and to appreciate what he takes to be salutary about Platonic metaphysics, namely that it views the world of the senses as non-existent (which, as Seneca thinks, makes it easier for us to deal with illnesses and death).

As Inwood notes, Seneca makes a key move away from earlier Stoic theory: he subsumes corporeals and incorporeals under 'what is' (rather than arguing that the supreme genus under which corporeals and incorporeals fall is 'somethings,' as the early Stoics did). What precisely are the implications of this move? Seneca dismisses early Stoic theory in a rather significant way by reintroducing the notion of 'what is' as our starting point for an inventory of reality. If one wanted to settle the dispute about Seneca that runs through Inwood's book, this would be a question to study closely. Does Seneca fully think through, and genuinely care, about all implications of viewing 'being' as the highest genus? Does he see the difficulty which both Plato and the early Stoics might point out to him, that if he makes being a central notion, it is not clear how he can (as he wishes) get by without a notion of not-being?

Letter 65 is concerned with causation. Seneca is entirely Stoic in considering god (or the active principle) as the only cause. Inwood analyses Letter 65 with an interesting focus on Seneca's engagement with Plato's Phaedo. I think Inwood is right in pointing out that -- as Seneca says -- it is a core claim of the Stoic theory of causation that there is only one cause. Like Letter 65, Letter 106 is in agreement with Stoic physics: the good is a body. One might have expected hesitations from Seneca's side, since at other times he likes to use 'body' in a way that is inspired by a dualism between soul and body (body being that which pulls us down and ties us to the bodily desires). But Seneca is not only firm in his commitment to the Stoic view. He also explains why, to a Stoic, there really cannot be any question about the corporeality of the good. The fact that the good is a body follows directly from the idea that nothing other than a body can move a body. The good has causal power (the good benefits; virtue makes us perform particular actions; etc.). Therefore, it must be a body. However, 65 and 106 may jointly reinforce the doubts regarding Seneca's interest in ontological questions that Inwood tries to dispell: how can Seneca be so strongly committed to some aspects of Stoic ontology, and still dismiss its foundation, that 'somethings' are the highest genus?

Letter 117 lines up with Letter 106 in discussing the way in which the good is corporeal. Here one encounters a clear case of a technicality: what it means that wisdom is a good, while being wise is not. The reason behind this distinction is that wisdom, qua state of the soul, is corporeal, but 'being wise,' a predicate, is not. Predicates are incorporeals, and therefore cannot be good (the good benefits, i.e., has causal power, and therefore must be a body). Throughout the letter, Seneca postpones taking a firm stance on whether he thinks the Stoic distinction between wisdom and 'being wise' is right, though he does say many things that make it implausible. His real answer, however, comes at the end of the letter, in the form of a rhetorical question. Seneca asks whether it would make him any wiser if he knew what position to take, with the clear implication that it would not (117.33). This is the kind of question that Seneca thinks we should not waste our lives investigating. Nevertheless, and here Inwood's point about Seneca's ambivalence seems important, Seneca's discussion of it is one of the few surviving texts on the issue, and thus central to our study of the Stoic position.

Inwood's translation is masterful, and his commentaries are of the greatest help to students and scholars of ancient philosophy. To me, Inwood's book shows in an impressive way that, whether Seneca is a technical philosopher or not, we need to read many of his letters philosophically. With the help of Inwood's book, Seneca's philosophical texts turn out to be most fruitfully studied in the context of the wider study of ancient philosophy. This seems to me highly significant for students and scholars who read Seneca as a philosopher. For them, as much as the philological precision and mastery of Inwood's book is welcome, it would on its own not be enough. At least with a view to those letters that Inwood selects, we need to read Seneca as students of ancient philosophy, interpreting Seneca's arguments with a view to those theories that Seneca knew and considered relevant. Inwood's new book is of the greatest help for that, and is likely to be the starting-point for future philosophical engagement with the selected letters.