Selected Writings on Aesthetics

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J.G. Herder, Selected Writings on Aesthetics, translated and edited by Gregory Moore, Princeton University Press, 2006, 468pp., $65.00 (cloth), ISBN 0691115958.

Reviewed by Katie Terezakis, Rochester Institute of Technology


"The Importance of Herder," as the title of Charles Taylor's 1991 essay declares, requires long overdue consideration. Recent English-language scholarship by Frederick Beiser, John Zammito, and Michael Forster has added to German-language landmarks by Rudolf Haym and Hans Irmscher and begun to establish the nature of Herder's historical and enduring import; the appearance of this translation of selected aesthetic writings makes the fundamental position of aesthetic theory within Herder's broad philosophical project widely accessible and thus promises to engender further investigation.

Gregory Moore's translation and Editor's Notes are outstanding. Herder's prose reads in English with urgency and wit; his manifold allusions and citations, as well as his occasional lexiphanicism, are scrupulously contextualized in notes that make for encyclopedic reading in their own right. The Introduction, though it repeats an overgeneralization or two about 'Western thought since Plato' and about Herder's refusal of Kant's critical project, relates a valuable account of Herder's milieu and of the general scope of the writings that follow, all but one of which are here translated into English for the first time. The selection -- ranging from 1766 to 1787 -- makes manifest Herder's pivotal position between critical idealism and philosophical naturalism and between the culture of Aufklärung and its most intimate critics; it also helps to illustrate Herder's foundational consequence in the development of modern hermeneutics, philology and a "historical-genetic" method of analysis, as well as his kinship with later initiatives of Dilthey, Nietzsche and Gadamer (to name a few).

Herder's philosophical writings are primarily concerned with the nature and scope of human reflexivity; this selection demonstrates that, far from constituting an auxiliary branch of this concern, his aesthetic theory yields its framework. Compare, for example, what is perhaps Herder's best-known work, the 1772 Treatise on the Origin of Language, with the 1787 "Image, Poetry, and Fable" presented here. As in the Treatise description, this later essay posits a pre-reflexive human being -- a literal impossibility envisaged in order to begin a line of reasoning about reflexivity -- in a chaotic sensible manifold, or here, a "forest of sensible objects," of which he becomes the master only by "separating objects from others, by giving them outline, dimensions, and form." "Becoming aware" (Besinnung) is an act of focusing attention on something, designating it as a something. Attentiveness to any sensible thing makes it more distinct; its distinction is a "stamp of our consciousness," or a "characteristic mark" by which it can be recognized and further surveyed. In the Treatise, Herder argues that the original act of appreciation or acknowledgment that yields the characteristic mark likewise marks the inauguration of language. With characteristic marking, thinking and language mutually unfold; consciousness is vitalized and oriented in its own acts of marking, which precede any verbalization, graphic signs or social communication. Nonetheless, the characteristic mark is a word; it is a translation of experience that necessarily designates what is special or remarkable to the observer. Herder's account of the origin and ongoing development of language is thus dependent upon natural, sensible being, and it is reliant upon a subjective framework that results in a view of the "inner language" of awareness as historical, contingent, narcissistic and fragmentary. (It is for this reason that Herder has been given credit for initiating expressivist theories of meaning, along with their purportedly attendant danger of meaning holism.[1])

Yet as "Image, Poetry, and Fable" most succinctly clarifies, Herder understands reflective marking, the primary and permanent activity of reason and language, to be an irreversibly aesthetic operation. When consciousness marks any object, its representation is foremost an image used to discriminate, according to the dictates of "inner sense," a "unity in diversity" (358). Herder holds that we know objects only as poetically generated images, but he does not support any reversion to a traditional "way of ideas." Instead, he argues that the images necessarily projected by subjective consciousness are arranged according to unchangeable rules of understanding; bound to the cognitive framework they signify, images also provide the mark of differentiation necessary for rational orientation. These sections, then, accentuate the degree to which Herder did accept and attempt to employ elements of the Kantian critical system, before his more reckless censure of it in the 1799 Metacritique of Pure Reason and the 1800 Kalligone.

Likewise, the 1769 "Fourth Grove" of his Critical Forests, Herder's contemptuous polemic against Riedel's Theorie der schönen Künste und Wissenschaften and letters Über das Publikum, is charged with Herder's mounting understanding of the primacy of human discursiveness. Well before the appearance of the first edition of Kant's first Critique, Herder's own formulation of the character of inferences and judgments, and his associated definition of the essence and scope of philosophy, are presented against the "pure sensualism" of Riedel, who argues for the immediacy of human perception of logical, moral and aesthetic truths. (Moore's Editor's Notes are especially beneficial in this section, for which he provides translations of the relevant excerpts from Riedel, now a historical dwarf in comparison with the gigantism of Lessing, whose Laocoön is the subject of Herder's "First Grove.") Placed in the real historical trajectory that Herder would be the first to insist upon, the underpinning of the philosophy of mind, language and history that Herder fleshed out in the 1760's and 1770's is patent in these arguments for a return to the Greek notion of aisthanesthai as an activity of sense perception -- replenished with an analysis of artworks qua sensuous representations.

In other words, Herder's still largely unemployed suggestions for studying the reciprocally transcendental and empirical operations of cognition necessarily entail his aesthetic theory, both insofar as Herder relates sensuous particulars and their schematization (in the Kantian sense) to a consciousness that unavoidably functions analogically and allegorically, and insofar as each sense, as Herder sees it, is paradigmatically presented by a particular kind of art. "A Monument to Baumgarten" (1767) lauds Baumgarten's definition of poetry as "sensuously perfect discourse" (to which Herder remains consistently faithful), announcing that this understanding instructs us to "make a psychological discovery with each rule of beauty" (45). Two years later, Herder is resolute, "because -- properly speaking -- visible beauty is nothing but appearance, there must therefore be an entire science, a great science devoted to its appearance, an aesthetic phenomenology… " (235). Building upon the juxtaposition of painting and poetry in Lessing's Laocoön, Herder uses the self-proclaimed disorder of the Critical Forests to begin distinguishing the different arts (now including sculpture, music and dance) in terms of their modes of representation. Herder "wish[es] that Mr. L had made Aristotle's distinction between work and energy the basis of his entire work" (102) and then goes on to make it the basis of his own (following James Harris, as Moore notes in his Introduction [9]). With that distinction, he establishes an important divergence between art works, whose parts temporally and spatially coexist, and energetic arts, which operate in and through time. The distinction allows Herder to set the stage for an account of the sovereignty of diverse arts, with their uniquely animating media demands, as well as to anticipate some of our contemporary concerns in modern and postmodern aesthetic theory.

Herder criticizes the "pregnant moment" identified in the Laocoön as the representation of both the material limitations of a given art form and the most fruitful impression of meaning for the receptive imagination (97ff). Presaging Novalis's critique of Lessing, Herder argues that since everything in nature is ephemeral, transitory appearance, Lessing's attempt to make a universal law from a delicacy of taste constitutes an unnatural violence -- to art no less than nature. "But what if this immutable Nature were also at the same time dead Nature? What if a body's permanence attested precisely to its soullessness? Then if this immutable permanence were made the aim of art without restriction -- how could this principle not deprive art of its best expression?" In spite of himself, Lessing has arrested the vitality of nature and sense in congruence with the most mechanistic of early modern systems. Herder's line of reasoning predicts debates about conceptual art that could reach a pitch only in the later twentieth century. His concerns about the essential means of sculpturally distinguishing figures are reflected in late modern and postmodern sculptural schemes, particularly as they increasingly interrogate and reject abstract typology (107ff),[2] and his subsequent ruminations on disgust, ugliness and terror in art (167ff), which he also develops against the Laocoön, raise important questions (albeit cursorily) about the ability of works to recognize and convey harmfulness, which might include the harms Herder associates with modern alienation earlier in the same manuscript (68ff).

Yet even before Herder tempers his criticism of the Laocoön by admitting that, while the idea of the pregnant moment should not be considered a principle or law of art, Lessing is right in holding that the climax of an emotion is abhorrent, imaginatively constraining and therefore worth avoiding (100), it becomes evident that Herder is adamantly refusing to get the real gist of Lessing's pregnant moment, no less than of his arguments for the petition of animal nature made through the physical suffering of Greek heroes, in particular Philoctetes. Herder's reading of these key concepts is not imperceptive, however; he seems rather to be sharpening Lessing's position in order to better establish its contrary: that there is no general formula in sensuous nature, beyond our regulation of its flux. So on the one hand, art that tries to present essences and ideals, when raised to the level of an injunction or a prescriptive law, proves to be both deadening and suicidal. On the other hand, however, there is an ideal of beauty for every art, attested to by the consistent transformations that constitute the diversity of taste (202). Lessing's first mistake, which stems from his failure to differentiate ergon and energeia in art, involves the assumption that the repetition of the gaze on a work can affect its character. A work is internally settled, by definition; its parts coexist simultaneously. A beautiful work is always taken in by a "single, eternal glance"; should that glance become ineffectual, jaded or caricatured, the abomination belongs not to the work, but to its spectator.

While Lessing's demarcation of the laws of poetry and painting may be gratuitously restrictive, Herder maximizes his critique of Lessing in order to work through his own theory that the faculties of cognition necessarily deal with images, and that the expression, elaboration and perfection of images follow immutable but subjective laws (359). When Herder repeatedly names these laws "truth" (by which he seems to mean internal consistency), "vividness" and "clarity," he is still circling around the notion that perception is fundamentally creative and that art works and energetic arts, in their sensuous representations, re-present both the inherent sensibility of higher order reasoning, and the fact that the internal synchronization of cognition is a matter of translation between each sense's imagistic markings, conjoined and designated by a schematism of analogy (365). Artworks present images that are saturated with the contingencies and characteristics of their times and purposes; their recipients must learn to utilize these images according to equally particular demands, but always following internal rules of conscious understanding, which recipients may better approach in the process. The ideal of beauty that endures in each art is thus a representation of the image-making nature of consciousness itself, achieving clarity and vividness in its sensuous intuitions and faithfulness in its analogical designations. Whereas Kant will soon argue, in the third Critique (§9), that the universal capacity for the communication of a mental state is the ground of a judgment of taste, necessarily producing a feeling of pleasure, Herder is struggling to articulate the insight that the capacity for communication itself, as well as the ground of an artwork's ability to convey meaning, rests upon communicability among our senses, which translate one another's marks according to their own requirements (359). If we had one sense, Herder explains, human reason could never arise, because reason is, fundamentally, a multi-sensory act of notice, marking and comparison that Herder, building upon his exchanges with Johann Georg Hamann, here calls "translating," "metaschematizing" and "alloisizing."

Even if Herder's attempts to work through the association of sense, mind and art is as insufficiently supported as it is remarkable, even if his vagueness about notions such as "force" in poetic language leaves us without the resources to confidently elucidate them, and even if he relies more on Lessing's aesthetic theory than he admits, Herder's foresight and wit in rejecting the alternate notion of aesthetic principles and their relationship to the imagination is invaluable. Responding to the "profound expression" with which Sulzer had himself engraved for the cover of his 1762 selected writings, which also herald the coming of Sulzer's aesthetic theory, Herder writes:

Following Mr. Lessing's principle, one would have to address [Sulzer's] image accordingly: 'Philosopher, will you have finished your aesthetics soon? Do your bowed head and raised finger not ache? Sighing Laocoön, for how long will you sigh? Will your bosom be oppressed, your abdomen contracted each time that I see you?' (99)

Further, read in conjunction with his extended theory of media and sensory demands, as well as that theory's reliance upon what one might call a translational model of meaning or mind, Herder's portrayal of genius, in the 1773 "Shakespeare" as well as the 1775 "On the Causes of Sunken Taste among the Different Peoples in Whom It Once Blossomed" also presents a serious challenge to the rendering of genius in Kant's third Critique. It thereby puts forward some compelling -- and surprisingly unique, given the amount of attention more recently paid to the topic -- reasons to reconsider the efficacy of genius's descendant, the avant-garde. The relation of genius and taste, and their joint reliance upon rational reflection is further pressed in the 1781 "On the Influence of the Belles Lettres on the Higher Sciences," although the essay returns to the more pedantic tone of the 1766 "Is the Beauty of the Body a Herald of the Beauty of the Soul?" While that latter essay, which is actually the earliest of this collection, does raise some important questions about embodiment and the relationship between aesthetic and moral valuations, these are largely obscured by the prating and patently racist route it takes to an ultimately trite conclusion. (Including it as the first essay in the collection might have been a matter of chronology, but its placement also serves to openly divulge the worst of Herder, without editorial comment, before his more commanding deliberations are presented.)

In any case, Herder's mark on philosophical modernity and his still undeveloped proposals may be much better discerned and elaborated with the publication of this extraordinary edition. As Moore mentions in his Introduction (7-8), Herder confesses, in a letter to Johann Georg Scheffner, to being so staggered by the initial appearance of Lessing's Laocoön that he read it from beginning to end three times on a single occasion. Though the size of this volume will prevent such an agile achievement, its provocations should prove as stimulating.

[1] Charles Taylor's two essays on the philosophy of language in Human Agency and Language, Philosophical Papers I (Cambridge University Press, 1985) and his "The Importance of Herder" in Isaiah Berlin: A Celebration, edited by Edna and Avishai Margalit (The University of Chicago Press, 1991), establish Herder's founding arguments in expressivism.

[2] Compare, for example, Herder's handling of sculpture in Critical Forests: First Grove 11, with Rosalind E. Krauss's essays on sculpture in The Originality of the Avant-Garde and Other Modernist Myths (MIT Press, 1986).