Selected Writings on Ethics

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John Duns Scotus, Selected Writings on Ethics, Thomas Williams (ed., tr.), Oxford University Press, 2017, 384pp, $35.00, ISBN 9780199673414.

Reviewed by Bonnie Kent, University of California, Irvine


This anthology by Thomas Williams testifies to his impressive skills, both as an editor and as a translator of Duns Scotus's notoriously troublesome Latin. The texts he includes, many of them never before translated into English, will probably not resolve the long-running dispute about the shape of Scotus's ethical theory as a whole. They should, however, give philosophical interpreters a somewhat clearer picture of his ethics.

Philosophers normally judge a translation by consulting the original text to see how well the translator succeeded in capturing its meaning. The original text is fixed; only translations of it vary. Readers of Williams's anthology might be surprised, then, by how often he revises the Latin texts before translating them. A little background should help to allay any suspicions aroused by the sheer number his revisions. (It might also serve as a warning to readers with boundless faith in the accuracy of critical editions.)

The work of greatest importance for understanding Scotus's ethics is his Ordinatio, a text he himself prepared, but one still incomplete at the time of his death and preserved only in a collection of manuscripts that editors have had major problems sorting out. From 1950 to 1973 a mere seven volumes of the critical edition were published, establishing the Latin text of the Ordinatio only up to Book II, distinction 3. People interested in Scotus's ethics griped about how slowly the editorial work was going, not least because the most relevant material appears later in Book II, and even more in Books III and IV. Over twenty-five years passed before the publication of volume 8, but then another six volumes followed with remarkable speed, so that in 2013 the critical edition of the Ordinatio was at last complete.

Scholars could no longer complain that they did not have some particular part of the Ordinatio that they needed. They could and did protest that the text of the critical edition, especially Book III, distinctions 8-40, includes a good deal of gibberish. Instead of working out a genealogy of the manuscripts and doing their best to establish a text that makes sense, the editors steadily gave priority to Codex A -- a policy all the more perplexing because, as Williams points out (p. xvi), the editors themselves admit that the text of Codex A after distinction 7 is often marred by "errors" and "incongruities."

What did Williams do to establish a more reliable Latin text? He drew mainly on Codex Q. Brief arguments for the superiority of Q are given in Williams's introduction (p. xvi). Scholars interested in more extensive arguments can find them on his website. Although this anthology does not include the Latin text on facing pages, Williams is scrupulous about reporting in footnotes how he emended the critical edition. He proves equally scrupulous about flagging in footnotes passages where Scotus's Latin is exceptionally puzzling, or where his translation does not stick as close to the Latin as it usually does.

I turn now to a question that some readers will surely have: how does this anthology by Williams compare with Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality, a similar volume published by Allan B. Wolter in 1986? Both contain texts by Scotus about philosophical psychology, especially ones discussing the will, as the necessary foundation for later reading selections more directly focused on ethics. Moving beyond Scotus's Ordinatio, both include a crucial question from his Questions on Aristotle's Metaphysics (Q. 15: "Is the distinction Aristotle draws between rational and non-rational powers appropriate?"), just as both include Quodlibetal Question 18 ("Does an exterior act add any goodness or badness to an interior act?"). Granted, the two anthologies are organized differently. Wolter organizes by topic, starting with "The Will and Intellect" and concluding with "Sin." Since Williams generally includes longer selections with multiple topics, he follows the order of the texts, adding a topical index to guide readers interested mainly in certain specific issues. On the whole, though, the two anthologies look at first glance to be much alike. This raises a crudely practical question: is there any good reason for someone who already owns the Wolter anthology to acquire the Williams anthology?

My answer is yes, mainly for three reasons:

(1) About forty percent of the selections in Williams's anthology are not in Wolter's. Even in cases of overlap, Williams often includes more of the text, so that readers have a better sense of the wider context, both textual and philosophical.

(2) Williams's translation sticks far more closely to the Latin. To give just one example, Scotus draws an important distinction between willing (velle), not willing (non velle), and willing against something (nolle). In order to avoid confusion between the second and third expressions, Williams consistently translates the third as 'willing-against.' In one passage Wolter translates it as 'nilling' and in another as 'dislike,' so that only someone checking the Latin text would recognize that Scotus is using the same word. While his anthology might be more enjoyable to read, it often comes closer to paraphrase than translation.

(3) An asset of Wolter's anthology from one perspective -- namely, over 120 pages of prefatory commentary -- represents a disadvantage from another perspective. Anyone who reads it might have trouble interpreting the texts in different ways, and all the more trouble in light of Wolter's translations. Williams's anthology includes no commentary at all, and, after more hours of checking his translations than I care to remember, I cannot see how it promotes any particular line of interpretation. His volume leaves readers free to make up their own minds, both about how to interpret particular texts and about how to understand Scotus's ethical theory as a whole. (Regrettably, both anthologies use the cognate 'habit' to translate habitus, a word in the vocabulary of scholasticism more accurately translated as 'disposition.')

People familiar with the secondary literature on Scotus's ethics might be a bit disappointed by just how cautious and scholarly the Williams anthology turns out to be. As an interpreter of Scotus, Williams has ventured gleefully into controversy about Scotus's metaethics. Starting in the late 1990s, he revived an old battle about whether Scotus defends a divine command theory, specifically targeting Wolter's claims to the contrary. Wolter defended himself at length, treating Williams like an annoying amateur ignorant of the manuscripts, and Mary Beth Ingham leaped to Wolter's defense. Williams briefly fired back, but then the controversy petered out. For this reason, one might have expected to find in Williams's anthology, if not another round in this long-running conflict among interpreters of Scotus's ethics, at least an effort to stockpile all the ammunition he needs in order to continue the battle in journal articles. What we find instead is a philosophically interesting series of texts, expertly translated by a careful scholar doing nothing to grind his own exegetical axe.

I cannot help feeling relieved, in part because the very framing of this controversy tends to mislead. In fact, Scotus has much less to say about God's commands than he does about God's will (or God's willing), and he does not interpret everything God wills as something he commands. Scotus follows earlier medieval philosophers in arguing that many bad human actions are ones God wills only in the sense of permitting them, then offers different interpretations of what it means for God to permit an action (Ordinatio I, q. 47). Now from the standpoint of John Calvin, probably the foremost defender of divine command theory in the history of Western ethics, any talk about divine "permission" is absurd -- and just so much more evidence, if any were needed, that medieval philosophers were deeply confused. Williams's anthology includes this particular selection from Scotus's work, whereas Wolter's anthology omits it. At least another five selections included by Williams but omitted by Wolter might likewise be adduced as evidence against the "divine command theory" interpretation of Scotus's ethical theory.

Readers more interested in Scotus's account of the virtues than his metaethics would do well to begin with the long excerpt from Ordinatio I, distinction 17: "Is a moral habit, as a virtue, in some way an active principle with respect to the moral goodness of an act?" In this text Scotus raises questions about what a moral habitus can actually explain that philosophers continued debating till the end of the Middle Ages. The selections from Ordinatio III, distinctions 33 and 36 discuss more conventional topics: whether moral virtues belong only to the will or also to the emotional part of the soul, and whether various kinds or virtues are connected. Both selections, however, reveal striking differences between Scotus's theory of virtue and the better-known theory of Thomas Aquinas.

Of course, the weakness of the Williams anthology is the flipside of its strength. I doubt whether it could be used on its own in teaching, except maybe in an advanced graduate course, any more than (say) the Cambridge edition of Kant's Metaphysics of Morals could be used on its own. It would be necessary to assign secondary literature to help students understand the text and alert them to scholarly controversies about exactly what the author means. While Wolter's anthology gives uninitiated readers the kind of background information they need, it also presses his own interpretation of Scotus's ethical theory.