Self and Emotional Life: Philosophy, Psychoanalysis, and Neuroscience

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Adrian Johnston and Catherine Malabou, Self and Emotional Life: Philosophy, Psychoanalysis, and Neuroscience, Columbia University Press, 2013, 276pp., $32.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231158312.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


Adrian Johnston and Catherine Malabou's important new book greatly helps the materialist turn in continental philosophy by precisely targeting the relations among psychoanalysis, continental philosophy, and affective neuroscience. Continuing the projects they have pursued in their previous work (Johnston 2005, 2008; Malabou 2008, 2010, 2012), the question of Self and Emotional Life could be said to be: what happens to the relation of psychoanalysis (Freud and Lacan) and continental philosophy (Derrida, Deleuze, Žižek) when the findings of contemporary affective neuroscience (Damasio, Panksepp, LeDoux) are taken into consideration? That is to say, what would a continental materialist theory of subjectivity look like when it takes the life sciences seriously?

It should be noted at the outset that this is not a co-authored book; rather, it is two independently written essays joined together. The authors do, however, discuss each other's work in the Preface, by Johnston, and in the Postface, by Malabou. There is also a certain difference in emphasis: Malabou focuses on philosophy and neuroscience, though with reference to Freud, to be sure; Johnston, for his part, focuses on psychoanalysis and neuroscience, though always in reference to Hegel and Žižek as philosophers.

In addition, as they both note, the basic orientations of the two authors differ. For her part, Malabou is critical of the way psychoanalysis has neglected the brain, such that the findings of affective neuroscience -- especially with regard to what she calls elsewhere "the new wounded" (Malabou 2012; that is, patients with brain damage severe enough to constitute a destruction of the previous subject) -- serve as a reproach to psychoanalysis, exposing subjects that psychoanalysis can "neither theorize nor treat" (xii). On the other hand, Johnston sees more room for mutual enlightenment, finding that an "immanent critique" that plays off the tensions within the long psychoanalytic tradition might allow for "a genuinely materialist and empirically up-to-date psychoanalysis" (xii).

While I think the authors are correct to claim that this is the first book to join the specific fields of continental philosophy, psychoanalysis, and affective neuroscience, there are a number of closely adjacent fields relevant to the materialist turn in continental philosophy, and the full value of the book will be realized in its networking effects, that is, in the mutually supporting and challenging connections it enables with those other fields. The domain to be investigated is the way social experience becomes embodied, or, conversely, the way the somatic is socialized. As Johnston puts it, the proper analysis of this domain can be neither biological reductionism nor social constructivism (188). It also means there never was a (non-social and mechanical) "first" nature; human nature is such that nurture becomes nature right from the start. (We will come back to the way Johnston treats basic emotions in relation to first and second nature.)

These themes are already being explored by scientific research in neuroplasticity (Wexler 2006) and epigenetics (Jablonka and Lamb 2005; West-Eberhard 2003), which are mentioned though not fully explored. Johnston and Malabou do discuss neuro-psychoanalysis (Solms and Turnbull 2002), but neuro-psychoanalysis doesn't have continental philosophy references (nor does it incorporate Lacan, as Johnston notes [200-201]). Slightly further afield, but I think with great potential, are the connections to be made with neuro-phenomenology and enactivism (Varela 1996; Thompson 2007), though it has to be said that the neuro-phenomenologists and enactivists do not engage with psychoanalysis very much. My own work doesn't deal with psychoanalysis but attempts to connect Deleuze with a politically expanded enactivism in cognitive science and biology (Protevi 2009; 2013). Finally, at the margins, there's social neuroscience (Cacioppo and Bernston 2004), as well as some philosophical work done on the Damasio-Spinoza connection (e.g., Ravven 2003), but these don't engage psychoanalysis or continental philosophy.

Malabou's contribution should be read in conjunction with her previous work -- What Should We Do With Our Brain? (2008;  NDPR review), Plasticity at the Dusk of Writing (2010; NDPR review), and The New Wounded (2012; NDPR review) -- in order to appreciate the full contours of her powerfully impressive project of constructing a materialist rejoinder to Hegel, Heidegger, and Derrida. Here Malabou examines the concepts of affect, affection, auto-affection, heteroaffection, hetero-heteroaffection, and dis-affection in a network of texts: Damasio, Deleuze, and Derrida as readers of Descartes and Spinoza. The leading thread is the analysis of wonder (admiratio) as "the capacity to be amazed" (8).

To set the stage for her contribution, Malabou guides us through the way in which "affect" in Deleuze's reading of Spinoza enfolds affectio and affectus, being-affected by the encounter with another body so that it affects one's power of being. Affect then is variation in conatus, changes in our power of persisting in being wrought by encounters. We then move to auto-affection as the form of subjectivity as sketched out in Heidegger's Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics. The empirical experience of the subject is in time, but that which provides the form of time is atemporal and transcendental, the Transcendental Unity of Apperception.

At this point, the question is the "metaphysics of presence" in the notion of auto-affection as pure self-touching. For Derrida, there is never a pure auto-affection, but always hetero-affection; there is what one could call an economy of exteriority such that there is an other inside our experience: we are always spaced, and there is always an external other. (Malabou notes the way the prime instance for Derrida of that self-present auto-affection changes, from the voice hearing itself speak to self-touching as auto-affection.)

For Derrida and Damasio, Descartes is the exemplar of pure auto-affection, but Deleuze will recognize in him a surpassing of the subject toward a plane of immanence. Malabou shows how, in Deleuze's course lectures on cinema (2 Feb 1982), he produces a reading of Descartes's Passions of the Soul in which "the face becomes the Cartesian plane of immanence par excellence, as if the soul's internal spacing is projected itself on it" (46).

However, in their own accounts, Damasio and Deleuze will look at auto-affection differently. Deleuze connects affect to auto-affection in Spinoza's third form of knowledge in the Ethics, where we find a non-subjective auto-affection. Rather than subjective, it's ontological: the auto-affection of essence, the internal agreement in adequate ideas of our essence, the essence of other things, and God / Nature's essence (44; Malabou here cites both Spinoza and Deleuze's online lectures on Spinoza; the point is also made at Deleuze 1988, 51).

Turning then to Damasio, Malabou shows how the tri-partite distinction in The Feeling of What Happens (1999) of proto-self, core consciousness, and autobiographical self allows one to locate the moment of auto-affection in the unconscious maintenance of homeostasis that makes up the proto-self (31-32; 67). But -- and here is the lynchpin of Malabou's argument -- the material neurological subject is open to the possibility of hetero-heteroaffection, that is, beyond mere heteroaffection of "an other" internal to the subject, the subject is exposed to material damage leading to dis-affection. This is an "effective" (11) or "biological" (58) "deconstruction of the subject," what Malabou calls "destructive plasticity." She then claims psychoanalysis cannot explain or cure the changes to subjectivity wrought by brain damage and studied by neuroscience.

While I believe Malabou has a good case to make with regard to psychoanalysis, her further claim that neurological findings of hetero-heteroaffection are "the most radical way" to thematize heteroaffection (64), that is, more radical than Derrida and Deleuze, is less secure. I will leave Derrida to the side for the purposes of this review, and focus on her claim that Deleuze will "delocalize the natural body" (68). But there is no "natural body" to be delocalized; this is the basic claim of the theory of materialist subjectivity Malabou and Johnston pursue, and it is one that Deleuze and Guattari would support, as the notion of "desiring-production" in Anti-Oedipus makes clear -- the social is not a super-structure to a natural infrastructure.

On a more technical note, the following passage in support of the claim that Deleuze will "delocalize the natural body" moves very quickly over complex territory.

The absence of organs, for Deleuze, means the lack of organization, as if our flesh, our blood, our brain were suspected of being the material expressions of metaphysics, as substance, system, presence, and teleology are such expressions. The "Body Without Organs" remains a body but it only presents itself as a surface to slip over or bounce off of. It is a plane. (68)

Now, it is the case that Deleuze and Guattari look at the organism as the "judgment of God" in A Thousand Plateaus, a move that supports Malabou's claim about metaphysics, but in my opinion the "organism" in question here is political as much as it is biological. What happens in the construction of an "organism" is the material neuro-somatic-social construction (construction of the affective-cognitive patterns, thresholds, and triggers) of a body fit for work in a particular social system; that is, the construction of a peasant, a warrior, a soldier, a factory worker -- with their attendant racialized and gendered aspects. In other words, Deleuze and Guattari insist that constructing the organism -- and reconstructing it in some other way via a construction of a Body without Organs as a way station -- has to be done so as to avoid damaging the biological viability of the body (Deleuze and Guattari 1987, 161). That is to say, in A Thousand Plateaus the BwO is the move toward a new "body politic," a new experimental arrangement of a politically patterned neuro-somatic body; it is not the catatonic body of Anti-Oedipus, a mere surface off of which socialized "flows" slip, but it is a stage in the capture and patterning of those flows in a new body.

In any case, these are technical issues, and that being said, Malabou's contribution to Self and Emotional Life is a very valuable addition to not only her own philosophy, but also to the important turn of continental philosophy toward neuroscience and biology.

In his contribution, Johnston focuses on the relation of affect and the unconscious in the psychoanalytic tradition. With careful scholarship, he nuances two standard stories. The first is that there is a clear break in Freud at the point of the second topography in 1923, such that we find a "before" in which unconscious affect is a contradiction in terms, and an "after" in which it is admitted (at least with regard to unconscious sense of guilt). The second story is that Lacan adamantly claims that there is only a Freudian disavowal of unconscious affect. This feeds into a criticism that Lacan neglects affect, being interested only in cognition, signifiers, structure, and so on. After complicating these received stories, Johnston then looks to contemporary affective neuroscience for support of the notion of unfelt -- or better, misfelt -- feelings. This is then fed back into a reading of Žižek and Lacan with regard to the radical interweaving of cognition and affect, language and feeling, structure and energy, nature and culture, and all their substitutes. Johnston appropriately casts the radical interweaving thesis in Hegelian terms as the critique of immediacy (85-86).

I will leave it to others better versed in the Freudian and Lacanian tradition to evaluate Johnston's interpretive textual work here; suffice it to say that I was highly impressed by the carefulness of his scholarship and the clarity and economy of his exposition. I would like to spend the rest of this review on Johnston's more strictly philosophical and argumentative work bringing contemporary neuroscience into relation with the Hegel-Lacan-Žižek critique of the immediacy of affect. (Of course, having said that, I must add that there is no clear distinction here; there is argument in the textual analyses just as there is textual interpretation in the argumentation.)

Some of Johnston's most insightful and interesting comments concern the interplay of two Lacanian concepts-terms-puns: lalangue and jouis-sens. Lalangue is babbling prior to and still inhabiting mature language (la langue). In Johnston's formula, lalangue is "the nonsense uttered by babbling infants joyfully and idiotically reveling in the bodily pleasures of pure, senseless sounds" (142). Lalangue however "lingers on in the linguistic productions of more mature speaking subjects" (142). The presence of lalangue in adult language (la langue) is paralleled by the presence of meaning in affect, the sens in jouis-sens (a portmanteau phonetically identical with jouissance; it is best translated as "enjoy-meant".) Johnston will then link the profusion of lalangue and the relative sparseness of la langue to the concept of neuronal pruning in infant development, in which neuronal over-production allows for inactive synapses to die off (195-196). This is in turn brought back to psychoanalysis and forward to epigenetics, via the work of Gérard Pommier (2007). In Johnston's reconstruction, Pommier shows that

these eliminations and selections are pruning processes through which the wild thickets of lalangue's jouis-sens-laden babbling (i.e., primary processes) are cut down (albeit, for psychoanalysis, not purged altogether without remainder) into the narrower confines of recognizably meaningful forms of une langue (i.e., secondary processes) (197).

At first glance, the role of the caretaker here seems negative, interventionist, and solely linguistic, rather than positive, catalytic, and corporeal. That is to say, it seems to support the criticism that Lacan neglects affect, a criticism that Johnston strives to defang. As I will show, Johnston has the resources to complicate this critical first impression, but for now, let me follow up on this line. Johnston frames the above passage thusly: "the eliminations and selections imposed on the child's neural network . . . are imposed thanks to the interactive interventions of significant (and signifying) others actively engaging with the child" (197). Now I certainly agree that child-caretaker interactions are how neuroplasticity operates; Johnston is entirely correct in explicating Pommier as in touch with current notions: "the plastic human brain . . . is genetically destined to be turned over to shaping vicissitudes far from entirely preprogrammed by evolutionary-genetic influence alone . . . in short, [the brain] is hardwired to be rewired" (197).

An interesting supplement to the negative linguistic pruning aspect can be found elsewhere in the new attention by cognitive science researchers to what we could call corporeal intersubjectivity. Among other topics, researchers have paid special attention to the work on "primary intersubjectivity" by Andrew Meltzoff, Daniel Stern, and Colwyn Trevarthen. Shaun Gallagher often cites Meltzoff's work on neonatal facial imitation in developing the notion of an infantile body schema, which makes individuation a process of modulating a relation rather than breaking free of a fusion with the mother (Gallagher and Meltzoff 1996; Gallagher 2004). Daniel Stern's recent Forms of Vitality has some concise descriptions of "affective attunement," in which a caretaker matches the affective dynamics of the infant, but in another modality (e.g., voice rather than gesture), so that there is no mere imitation, but a "signature" indicating the matching of internal states (Stern 2010, 41; 113). But it is Dissanayake's (2000) and Trevarthen's (1999) interest in what comes to be called "communicative musicality" (Malloch and Trevarthen 2010) in the rhythmic multi-modal interaction of caretaker and infant that's the key for me. The infant and caretaker engage in a rhythmic interchange of cooing, babbling, rocking, sucking, grasping, and so on. Yes, undoubtedly negative linguistic pruning occurs, but corporeal interchange has positive accomplishments as well.

That being said, the Lacanian notion of the materiality of the signifier that Johnston incorporates into his approach allows us to nuance this first impression and acknowledge that there is no sharp separation between the linguistic and the corporeal or the negative and positive in infant-caretaker interaction. After all, that interaction is corporeal and linguistic at once: cooing and gurgling and reflected babbling blending into "Motherese" is right there all along with rocking and stroking and petting. Similarly, with regard to the negative-positive polarity, the negative pruning is exactly what produces the positivity of neural wiring.

So with that interweaving in mind, let me offer the above references to corporeality as a supplement rather than a criticism of Johnston; it's a matter of emphasis of presentation, I think, rather then strict separation of approaches. The same holds for my last point. Johnston will say that "nature" -- here in the form of basic emotions such as rage and panic -- will peak through into "culture" in "rare, extreme conditions" (193). This is true, but I would offer a slight nuance. You could say that the basic emotion qua affect program is stereotyped and shows similarities with other mammalian reactions, but even if the pattern is similar the triggers are cultural: the music and dance that could set off a berserker frenzy in one group would just sound like gibberish to another.

But as with my discussion of Malabou's contribution, these minor criticisms are technical issues that should not distract from the overall praise that Self and Emotional Life deserves as a major contribution to the important materialist turn in continental philosophy.


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