Self and Identity

Self And Identity

Trenton Merricks, Self and Identity, Oxford University Press, 2022, 184pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192843432.

Reviewed by Roy W. Perrett, independent


Trenton Merricks’ latest book addresses what he takes to be an unfortunate fragmentation in the contemporary literature on personal identity between discussions of ethical issues about what matters in survival and metaphysical issues about the numerical identity and persistence of persons. He believes the trouble here is due to a failure to distinguish clearly between the following two (distinct) questions (1):

The What Question: What is it for a person at a future time to have (at that time) what matters in survival for you

The Why Question: What way of being related to a (conscious) person at a future time explains why that person will have (at that time) what matters in survival for you?

That these two questions are in fact distinct is evidenced by the fact that so many philosophers answer these two questions differently. Many answer the What Question in terms of appropriate first-personal anticipation or concern, but answer the Why Question in terms of some kind of psychological connectedness or continuity.

In other words, many philosophers’ answers to the What Question—including Merricks’ own—thereby concede that identity is not what matters in survival. But that need not imply that identity is irrelevant to what matters in survival. Indeed, Merricks goes on in Chapters 2 and 3 to defend the claim that numerical identity is a good answer to the Why Question because diachronic personal identity is both sufficient and necessary for what matters in survival.

Merricks’ case in Chapter 2 for the sufficiency of personal identity builds upon his own preferred answer to the Why Question: namely, being numerically identical with a person at a future time explains why it is appropriate for you to first-personally concern yourself with the future experiences of that person. This is not currently a popular view among philosophers. To be sure, Merricks only insists that numerical identity is one good answer to the Why Question, not that it is the only good answer. But even this is still a controversial claim to make, and Merricks’ defence of it rests on another controversial claim about the metaphysics of persons, which he has defended more fully elsewhere: namely, that persons persist by enduring, rather than perduring. Here Merricks does briefly sketch some considerations that he thinks tell against perdurantism, but since he does not assert that numerical identity is the only good answer to the Why Question, all he absolutely needs to assert at this point in the dialectic is that, given endurantism, numerical identity would be one good answer to the Why Question.

The case presented in Chapter 3 for the necessity of personal identity is a bit more complicated. Like many other philosophers, Merricks holds that personal identity over time is necessary for what matters in survival. But in recent times that consensus has been challenged by Derek Parfit and Merricks develops an extended critique of Parfit’s argument, concluding that not only is numerical identity a good answer to the Why Question, but also that every good answer to it implies numerical identity.

Chapter 4 considers the suggestion that every good answer to the Why Question implies having the “same self” and thus sharing features that are constitutive of making you the person you are. Merrick calls philosophers who accept this view “Selfers”, and he takes John Perry, Marya Schechtman and Jennifer Whiting to be among their number. Against this sort of position he invokes a variety of colourful thought experiments (featuring, inter alia, vampires, Nazis and George Orwell’s 1984) in support of rejecting their position as implausibly implying that you cannot survive a change in self.

Chapter 5 discusses a related view (also defended by Marya Schechtman) that replaces “same self” with “same self-narrative”: that is, the same story of a life. On this view the features that make you the person you are are those that are included in your self-narrative. So, you cannot survive losing your self-narrative. Merricks is predictably unpersuaded by how the self-narrative account of survival answers the Why Question in terms of psychological connectedness that is constituted by having the same self-narrative. He is, however, much more sympathetic to the suggestion that narrative-constituting psychological continuity might still be somehow relevant to answering the Why Question.

Chapter 6 explores one such proposal, advanced by Christine Korsgaard, which appeals to a kind of narrative continuity, rather than narrative connectedness. This can then be combined with the notion of an agential continuity constituted by overlapping instances of “agential connectedness”, where overlapping instances of a person’s choosing to act result in that person having various psychological states. This account would have the advantage of being able to accommodate transformations being good for you, provided that the transformations are gradual enough to preserve agential and narrative continuity.

Merricks nevertheless urges a number of reasons for rejecting these sorts of answers to the Why Question. One is that it seems possible that you could become an evil person, without this resulting from your own actions (once again a thought experiment involving twee vampires and their corrupting bites makes an appearance here). Although such a fate would be bad for you, it would not be bad for you only in the way that ceasing to exist would be bad for you. But that is contrary to what the agential theory would imply in such a case.

Chapter 7 (“The Hope of Glory”) is the final chapter of the book, and my personal favourite. Its style and tone are significantly different from what has gone before, though crucially related to those earlier chapters. Merricks himself suggests:

you could read this chapter as continuing to explore what matters in survival with one last thought experiment, a thought experiment involving a certain sort of personal immortality. Or you could read this chapter as applying the lessons of the preceding chapters to the philosophy of religion. (157)

There is a kind of “dilemma of immortality”, well-known to philosophers of religion. On the one hand, many religious traditions recognise that the positive significance of immortality cannot consist simply in endless duration. (Compare Wittgenstein’s complaint at Tractatus 6.4312: “Or is some riddle solved by my surviving forever? Is not this eternal life itself as much of a riddle as our present life”.) Typically, then, we are instead encouraged to believe we are going to be radically transformed in value in the afterlife. But then it is no longer clear that the promised transformation is identity-preserving in such a way that our first-personal anticipation or concern for that future is appropriate any longer. So it seems that either the promised eternal afterlife is of no special value, or it may be valuable but it is not my afterlife.

Merricks’ final chapter addresses this dilemma. He accepts the first horn of the dilemma and concedes that the religious promise of immortality should involve the expectation that we will be profoundly transformed. This is what he calls “the hope of glory”: the hope that we will be transformed into something that will be good for us and survive forever. But will it be me that so survives? It is at this point that the careful analytic investigations of the earlier chapters of the book are finally brought to bear. According to what has been said earlier, we can indeed survive transformations that involve acquiring new psychological capacities of which we cannot now form any conception—in much the same way as much a small child grows up by acquiring new psychological capacities and becoming a mature adult. According to Merricks’ answer to the Why Question, we can survive those identity-preserving transformations to become glorified provided that we preserve numerical identity. Since numerical identity does not admit of degrees, survival too does not come in degrees—which is not the case with psychological continuity.

In terms of Merricks’ distinct answers to his What Question and his Why Question, he maintains that even though the idea of personal immortality is not the idea that there will always be some conscious being identical with you, you will enjoy personal immortality just in case there will always be some conscious being who is identical with you (6).

Chapter 7 ends with brief replies to two objections to the rationality of the hope of glory. The first objection (inspired by Bernard Williams) is that surely it would be unbearably tedious to live forever, and hence it is not a reasonable fate to hope for. Merricks replies that since we cannot know in advance what it would like to be glorified and immortal, we cannot know that we would become bored with immortality. The second objection is that if we cannot know in advance what it would be like to be glorified and immortal, we cannot have good reason to believe it would be good for us. Basically, Merricks replies that it still would not be irrational to hope. It is unclear, however, that this apologetic strategy establishes any more than that the hope of glory is at least weakly rational, in the sense that it cannot be shown to be irrational. It cannot establish that such a hope is strongly rational, in the sense that it is irrational not to hope. But arguably this suggests that agnosticism about hope may be the appropriate response best adopted by both parties in the dispute.

There is a lot of clever and intricate argument packed into this relatively short book, and it is not at all an easy read. Caveat lector! This is not, however, to be blamed on any carelessness of technical craft on Merricks’ part: indeed, his repeated previews of what is to come and his recaps of where we have been are extremely helpful for any reader’s efforts to orient themselves. Rather the difficulty is because Merricks’ book, despite being motivated by philosophical issues that any thoughtful person would judge to be fundamental, is also a fearsomely scholastic work, in both positive and negative senses of that term.

On the positive side, the book exhibits typically scholastic concerns with analytical subtlety and logical rigour, sustained intricacy of argumentation, the frequent introduction of ingenious technical innovations, and a characteristic drive for philosophical systematisation. But we also find a kind of philosophical writing that expects of its readers a tolerance of a high level of abstraction, a familiarity with a complicated jargon, education in a common curriculum and canon of texts, and an ability to pick up on learned allusions. It is, in other words, philosophy for professional philosophers (and their graduate students), not for the general educated reader. And yet, ironically, the fundamental philosophical topic that motivates the book is likely of keener interest to the general educated readers who might struggle in the rarefied air of its conceptual highlands than to those professionals who might better appreciate the intellectual skills Merricks brings to bear on the issues.