Self-Consciousness and Objectivity: An Introduction to Absolute Idealism

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Sebastian Rödl, Self-Consciousness and Objectivity: An Introduction to Absolute Idealism, Harvard University Press, 2018, 198 pp., $45.00, ISBN 9780674976511.

Reviewed by Peter Thielke, Pomona College


You likely don't think that you're an absolute idealist, though if Sebastian Rödl is right, you are already one, though almost certainly unbeknownst to yourself. This is a central claim of the volume under review. The title might suggest a survey of 18th and 19th C. German thought, but while Rödl tangentially draws on several of these historical figures, his book is emphatically not a work in the history of philosophy. It is rather an incredibly ambitious attempt to show not just that Absolute Idealism has been roundly misunderstood, but also that such a view is the only coherent form that philosophy can take. This is, to put it mildly, a highly contentious and initially counterintuitive claim, but in the course of his fascinating, challenging, dense, and at times perplexing and frustrating work, Rödl builds a surprisingly strong case for Absolute Idealism -- though if he is right that this is the only form philosophy can take, perhaps this should not be surprising at all. Even if it brings few people over to Absolute Idealism, the book will challenge the foundational orthodoxies of much of contemporary epistemology and metaphysics.

Both in its style and its methodology, this book bears little resemblance to standard philosophical monographs, though I suspect that this is largely by design. Rödl's tone borders on the oracular; the arguments are concise, to the point of almost being gnomic; and there are few examples provided to illustrate the often recondite points made. This seems to be deliberate, since it relates to the method that Rödl adopts: the book, he explains

propounds no theses, advances no hypotheses, does not recommend a view or position . . . As it aims to express the comprehension of judgment that is contained in any judgment, the present essay can say only what anyone already knows, knows in any judgment, knows insofar as she judges at all. (13)

The work itself is offered as a formula of universal knowledge: Rödl seeks not to convince us of anything, it seems, because we already know -- in some inchoate sense -- what he sets out. Since the formula of knowledge just is Absolute Idealism, we are also all committed to this view, whether we recognize it or not. And, Rödl proposes, bringing such an idealism to light will require upending the very conception of what philosophy involves, by showing how "absolute knowledge is nothing other than empirical knowledge and empirical knowledge nothing other than absolute knowledge" (18). This is an ambitious project!

Rödl's general target seems to be a broadly realist view that holds that reality is wholly external to thought, and that the role of judgment is to bring us as knowers incrementally closer to this simply given independent world. On this view, we start with our merely subjective perceptions and gradually work our way towards an objective grasp of external reality. Rödl's variety of Absolute Idealism, by contrast, rejects the idea that reality is simply something given, and instead advances the position that all reality is accessible to thought because reality is already included in judgment. It's important to note that for Rödl, Absolute Idealism is not really a variety of idealism at all, if this is taken to be the view that reality is the product of the mind alone. Absolute Idealism "is the most radical, the most thorough, and the only sound rejection of that [position]" (15).

Rather than summarize each of the book's ten very dense chapters, I will try to provide a broad overview of Rödl's position, and then turn to some questions about what exactly Absolute Idealism amounts to. I should confess, though, that I am not entirely confident I have plumbed the depths of this book, and given the complexity of Rödl's position (I will try not to say argument), I am not sure that I can fully do it justice here.

The starting point for Rödl's exposition lies in the claim that thought and judgment are objective, in the sense that whether it is right to think or judge something depends on the thing thought, and not on the particular character of the person who thinks it. But, thought is also self-conscious, an act of a thinker. Traditionally, objectivity and self-consciousness are assumed to be two opposed poles, each contributing something to the structure of judgment: judgment involves both a content, which purports to be objective, as well as something like a propositional attitude toward this content, which reflects the state of the self-conscious subject. It is this model, which distinguishes between what is judged and the act of judging it, that Rödl entirely rejects. Rather, judgment is itself self-conscious, or contains within it the recognition of its own validity; as Rödl puts it, the "self-consciousness of judgment entails its objectivity: as judging that things are so is thinking it valid that they are, the validity of a judgment can depend on nothing that one does not apprehend in this very judgment" (11). In a judgment, one does not entertain some propositional content, and then adopt an attitude towards it; instead, the judgment includes inside it a self-conscious recognition of its own valid thought.

Rödl's account of judgment then stands firmly opposed to any view that tries to distinguish between the content and force of -- or attitude towards -- a proposition. The latter position, Rödl maintains, is incoherent, since it would mean that the self-conscious character of thought would be lost. This is particularly acute in the case of first-person judgments. If the content of proposition p were separate from a thinker's attitude towards it, then 'I think p' would be distinct from 'p,' and as a proposition, the truth of 'I think p' would not depend on anyone affirming it, since its content alone ostensibly determines its truth. But the only way in which 'I think p' can occur is if the thinker recognizes that she thinks p, which means that the truth of 'I think p' does depend on her affirming it. This shows, Rödl claims, that the 'I think' cannot be external to a proposition: to think that one thinks p is just to self-consciously think p. The 'I think' that is included in this judgment "is not a proposition. The first-person pronoun is no variety of reference, but an expression of self-consciousness: it signifies the internality to what is thought of its being thought" (25). But, the 'I think' is also not the product of applying an external rule to judgment. Rather, in following a rule one self-consciously takes oneself to be doing so, just as (for Kant) one who acts from duty does not merely abide by the moral law, but acts from it (33). The subject self-consciously recognizes that she is following the rules of thought, and such rules are found in all thought. In this respect, thought is objective precisely because it is self-conscious, and this in turn means that what is thought cannot be separated from the act of thinking.

That judgment is self-conscious, Rödl insists, is not something that can be coherently denied, since this is a feature of all judgment. The science of judgment is "without contrary," because its opposite cannot even be formulated. Rather, it is something that all self-conscious thinkers already recognize: "as the I judge is inside p, inside the object of judgment, judging anything at all is thinking I judge" (40). Although Rödl does not make this claim explicitly, the idea here seems to be that the strongly internalist, self-conscious structure of judgment stands as a necessary condition on any judgment at all, and to deny this while trying to retain an alternative account of judgment is to engage in a meaningless enterprise, since one must use just such self-conscious thought in order to try to express a different view. It is impossible to reject this account of judgment, since it stands as the science without contrary. This is not a normative claim, Rödl seems to suggest, one which would tell us how we should view judgment; instead, it expresses the fundamental factual truth about the nature of judgment, and insofar as we are thinkers, it holds for us uniformly. All thought is self-conscious: it is not as if some of my judgments are self-conscious and others are not, since otherwise there could be no unity amongst my thoughts.

The structure of judgment also means that its study is not just one branch of inquiry among others, but rather must be conceived as the science, or the science without contrary. Here, Rödl proposes that "the science of judgment -- knowledge of the nature of judgment -- is at the same time the science of the object of judgment -- knowledge of the nature of the object of judgment. And the object of judging is everything" (55). The ground of Absolute Idealism is first exposed here, since to know what judgment is also involves knowledge of what judgment is about: illimitable reality. This reality is not brutely given, but is instead the world comprehended by and in judgment, since "the concept of things' being as they are is possible only as it is at work -- not in thinking this or that -- but in thinking anything at all. The concept of being, reality, the facts, is possible only as contained in the I think" (61). Our engagement with the world comes through our sensibility, but this is not something external to judgment, nor does sensibility limit objectivity, and we "need to comprehend sensibility to be contained within the self-consciousness of judgment" (83).

Because the science of judgment is without contrary, it needs no validation, but there are also judgments with contrary -- empirical claims -- that require justification. The details of Rödl's account are very dense on this point, but the general claim, if I understand it correctly, is that justification must be grounded in the power of judgment itself, which "is the cause that renders valid judgment necessary" (105). This includes both judgments of perception, in which the subject knows "that things are so . . . [but] not why they are" (108), and judgments of experience, which appeal to causes as justification. Since they involve justification, judgments of experience are with contrary, but the appeal to the power of judgment allows us to avoid succumbing to the Myth of the Given, since the power and act of knowledge "have no given measure, but are their own measure" (124).

The problem that this raises, Rödl continues, is that since there are no apodictic judgments of experience, there is seemingly no sense in claiming that I recognize necessity in my judgment, which looks like it is part of the validity of any judgment. Rödl proposes that the solution to the problem can be found in the principles of inference or logic, which are themselves without contrary, and in which "a judgment of experience is constituted as such in the consciousness of the principle of inference" (144). And, these principles of judgment are at the same time principles of being: they tell us both what judgment involves and what the objects of judgment are: the "principle of judgment -- the self-knowledge of judgment -- is objectivity itself. It is all reality" (148).

This is the essence of Rödl's Absolute Idealism, which holds that "absolute knowledge is nothing other than the thought of the validity of empirical judgment," (154) or that "absolute knowledge is nothing other than the self-determining progression of the judgment of experience" (155). The empirical knowledge that we gain in the sciences is not simply some merely given or arbitrary content, but rather necessarily reflects -- although partially and incompletely -- the nature of all reality. In this respect, science and philosophy are identical, as are empirical and absolute knowledge: philosophy sustains the activity of science, and science seeks out the specific ways in which knowledge determines itself -- this is Absolute Idealism.

This brief summary cannot do justice to the rich and dense position that Rödl develops, and I have omitted a number of interesting and important details. But, for several reasons, this is a difficult book to evaluate: its style is far removed from more standard works, and its self-professed lack of an argument does not make a reviewer's job terribly easy. Indeed, it's not clear what critical standards would apply, if Rödl is indeed sincere in claiming that one cannot even deny the science of judgment. Still, a few lingering questions remain.

First, despite the book's subtitle, the nature of Absolute Idealism is not accorded much explicit discussion, though perhaps Rödl's aim is to have the book as a whole serve as a "formula" for the view. It's also not entirely clear what the identity of science and philosophy will amount to, and whether this is offered as grand new system of thought -- a kind of neo-Hegelianism, say -- or whether instead Absolute Idealism is better understood in more methodological terms, as a way of preserving and vindicating our empirical knowledge against the depredations of skepticism, psychologism, externalism and the other various opponents Rödl has in his sights.

Second, Rödl says very little about the role that error plays in our judgments. At one point, he parenthetically notes that "we are disregarding false judgments," (66) but this goes by too quickly. If we accept that judgment is objective and contains self-consciousness in it, and includes a notion of its validity, as Rödl urges, it is difficult to explain how we make judgments that turn out to be false, and why we frequently realize that we are liable to err. Indeed, we might think that the self-consciousness of judgment includes a sense of defeasibility as well as validity: when I judge provisionally, for example, it seems that I do so with an awareness that I might be wrong. If I assert that I will attend the concert tomorrow, for example, I also recognize that this might not come about, if circumstances change. But if that's the case, then it seems that a distinction between content and propositional attitudes might creep back into the picture, since the recognition that I might be wrong appears to assume a different attitude towards some judgments, even if they are all self-conscious.

Moreover, the issue of error is amplified by the claim that the principles of judgment are 'without contrary,' and that there is no other philosophy besides Absolute Idealism. If this is so, why are so many people mistaken in thinking, say, that propositional attitudes are distinct from the contents of thought, or that some form of externalism is right? If Absolute Idealism is the only coherent position, why is this not obvious to almost everyone? Rödl's claim that one cannot argue for Absolute Idealism makes it hard to see in what sense anyone could come to realize and renounce their errors, if indeed they are guilty of being philosophically misled.

Finally, the account of absolute idealism here brings to mind Karl Ameriks' critique of post-Kantian thinkers as resorting to the 'short argument' to idealism.[1] For Ameriks, figures such as Reinhold, Fichte and Hegel thought that reflection on the nature of representation alone shows that idealism must be true. By contrast, Kant's idealism is secured only after a long and difficult account of the nature of human forms of sensibility, which requires an explanation of the specific ways in which we represent sensible content.

Something similar might be said about Rödl's project, though in place of representation we could instead see him as starting with claim that it is "obvious that we possess empirical knowledge" (15). By starting with this 'obvious' fact, reflection on the nature of judgment alone seems to provide Rödl with a short path to Absolute Idealism. But just as Kant saw that he needed to undertake the difficult task of laying out the specific details of the human forms of sensibility, so too it might be incumbent on Rödl to specify exactly what empirical knowledge involves, and what conditions govern its acquisition and scope for us as particular human subjects. Empirical judgments come in all sorts of flavors and forms, and perhaps there is no ubiquitous element between them all. Nor is it always clearly obvious that we in fact do possess empirical knowledge -- rather than just beliefs, say -- when we make judgments about the world. While Rödl might take a short step from the objectivity and self-consciousness of empirical judgment to Absolute Idealism, I suspect that we must follow a much more arduous and lengthy path to get to the point where it is obvious that we have empirical knowledge.

Despite these reservations, this book is well worth reading. It launches a refreshing broadside against much of contemporary epistemology, and it sketches a novel and interesting defense of a view -- Absolute Idealism -- that has largely been consigned to the trash-heap of history. The challenge that the book presents to the realist orthodoxy that reigns in most philosophical circles needs to be taken seriously, and even if it doesn't win many converts, the position that it outlines must be engaged. Indeed, it might expose us to the ground on which we already stand, simply by virtue of being human judgers.


I am grateful to Jim Kreines and Daniel Moerner for their very helpful comments on a draft of the review.

[1] See, for example, Chapter 3 of Karl Ameriks, Kant and the Fate of Autonomy, Cambridge University Press, 2000.