Self-Consciousness and 'Split' Brains: The Minds' I

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Elizabeth Schechter, Self-Consciousness and 'Split' Brains: The Minds' I, Oxford University Press, 2018, 295pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809654.

Reviewed by Peter Godfrey-Smith, University of Sydney


The "split-brain" phenomenon has engaged philosophical interest from around the late 1960s. In some cases of severe epilepsy, a cut is made in the tissue that connects the two hemispheres of the upper part of the brain, the cerebral cortex. This affords relief as it stops seizures spreading easily from one side to the other. (The operation is done far less often now, but is still performed occasionally, more often in children.) Initially, this appeared to be a procedure with few other effects on the patient. But in some experimental circumstances, it can appear that the operation has produced a situation where two minds are present in one body. Could that be true?

Though the literature is now large and sophisticated, Elizabeth Schechter's is the first book-length treatment of the problem by a philosopher (though Marks 1981 is a short monograph published in book form). Schechter rethinks the issues carefully from the ground up, and makes connections to a range of other questions in the philosophy of mind. She defends a "two subjects" view: within the body of a split-brain patient, in at least some cases, two experiencing subjects exist. She combines this with the claim that a split-brain patient is just one person; those two units need not line up in a simple way. In this review, I will concentrate on the two-subjects claims, Schechter's treatment of what has traditionally been seen as the main question in this area.

Schechter has written an exceptionally good book. Its particular virtues are the care and rigor with which arguments are developed. The book seems to lack a single superficial moment. It also feels rather long and dense. Schechter makes use of a considerable amount of neurobiological detail, not all of which is made accessible to the non-expert -- this is as much a cognitive science book as a philosophy book. Though it is not especially easy once one arrives at the central chapters, the book remains more readable than it might have been, because Schechter's writing is very appealing -- deft and stylish, in an understated way. This may help keep you going as you make your way through a lot of argument. The book seems to me an exemplary piece of naturalistic philosophy of mind.

In split-brain cases, the corpus callosum connecting the two cerebral hemispheres is cut, physically separating some, though not all, of the two sides of the brain. In animals like us, information from the right visual field is directed to the left hemisphere, and vice versa. Each hemisphere also controls the hand on the other side of the body. The left usually controls speech (not always). Split-brain patients often (again, not always) appear normal in everyday life, but in experiments where information is channeled solely to one hemisphere or the other, surprises arise. Speech seems to be controlled by the left hemisphere, but the right can seem to have a mind of its own, with poorer routes for expression, mostly controlling the left hand.

From the time of Thomas Nagel's classic 1971 paper, there has seemed to be about half a dozen options for interpreting the situation. The most readily grasped are the view that the operation has permanently split the patient's mind into two, and the view that the left hemisphere houses a normal conscious subject while the right is a non-conscious automaton. Perhaps, alternatively, a single rather disorganized mind is present. More unusual options hold that the patient switches from having a single mind based in the left to having one based in the right, that the patient switches between having one mind (in normal life) and having two (in the experiments), or that mind is present but not in a way neatly organized into some definite number of subjects, one or two. This last option is called "partial unity."

Schechter favors a two-subject view. The earlier chapters argue for this view carefully. I am partly convinced -- convinced that sometimes there are probably two minds there. A good argument for this, appropriately emphasized by Schechter, is from cases where there appears to be a kind of opportunistic communication between the two hemispheres, communication that takes place semi-publicly. In a number of cases, the right hemisphere has apparently tried to convey messages to the left side by writing with a finger of the left hand onto the back of the right. This often seemed an attempt to undermine the experiment, whose aim was to show images to the right side and see if the left could describe them. Sometimes an experimenter has seen the left hand writing and instructed: "Don't write!"

This seems to tell against the idea that the right hemisphere contains little that is mind-like. Might the argument be resisted? In some other cases of poorly unified and troubled minds (though with no split), compulsive behaviors can be seen in a single hand (an "anarchic" or "alien" hand), usually the left. Similarly, might the split-brain behaviors above be a kind of compulsive expression of what is comprehended, not a deliberate attempt to get information across?[1] Schechter, in a brief discussion, describes "anarchic hand" cases as ones where the problematic limb is probably not under the control of intentional agency at all. It seems that split-brain cases can rightly be seen as different to the extent that the left-hand behaviors are smart and well-directed at getting information across -- writing on the back of the hand rather than the table or the leg on the same side, for example.

Suppose that experiment-based arguments of this kind are accepted. Then it seems that sometimes two minds are present. Are they always present? Schechter gives some, but very little, consideration to the possibility of a short-term switching between one mind and two, with the unusual information flows in the experiment causing the mental birfurcation. At least since Nagel's paper, this option has been on the table but has seemed far-fetched; it seems that merely entering or leaving an experimental situation would not be enough to split one mind into two or merge two into one. Schechter agrees, emphasizing the basic physical disconnection that the split-brain procedure induces.

Perhaps the switching possibility is not as odd as it seems. If a mind is, roughly speaking, a pattern of activity, then it seems that it might come into being suddenly. In everyday life, a pattern of the right kind exists only in the activity of the whole, while in the experiment this pattern of activity divides into two instances. However, how might one pattern of the right kind exist in everyday life? After all, the hemispheres are physically split. As Bayne (2005) and Downey (2018) have noted, what seems to be required is a version of what Hurley (1998) has called "vehicle externalism," the view that part of the material basis for a mind can be external to the body.[2] Downey has endorsed this combination.

Another unorthodox option is somewhat neglected in Schechter's book, though the option is one she has written about before. This option is "partial unity," the idea that in split-brain patients (and perhaps others) there is no simple count of subjects or minds, even at a given time; the mentality present in an animal or other system can be organized in a less discrete way (Lockwood 1989). Perhaps a component of experience E1 can be present with another, E2, and also present with E3, but in a situation E2 and E3 are not present with each other. It is hard to even think about such options, but in an earlier paper Schechter (2014) argued that partial unity is coherent and a live option. In this book, however, she hardly discusses it. The impression one gets is that she thinks it is empirically unlikely, though still coherent. She does, however, note that doctors and neuroscientists involved with split-brain patients do tend to accept partial unity, in an informal way and without working though the philosophical difficulties. This is because of the role of states like moods and emotions. It often appears that these states, when induced by a stimulus to one side, are also seen in the other -- or, if partial unity is true, characterize the whole. A distressing stimulus shown to the nonverbal right hemisphere seems to affect the mood of the verbal left hemisphere as well. Given that the split does not involve the whole brain but the upper part only, and much remains physically unified, this might seem a very natural interpretation of what is going on.

Although Schechter hardly discusses partial unity in the book's main text, she argues in a (difficult) Appendix, that the evidence for partial unity in affective states is not very convincing. For example, there are ways an emotional state could get from one subject to another -- with a different token coming to exist on either side -- in a split-brain situation with two minds present.

I agree that the evidence for partial unity seems far from clear, and perhaps things are as she says. Given its great philosophical interest, I am surprised that she didn't look more closely at partial unity. One reason for my own interest is the possibility that something like partial unity -- revealed to us in human split-brain cases -- might be present, though even more elusive, in many non-human animals. Animals in many cases (including vertebrates -- fish, birds, marsupials) have much less physical integration between different sides of their brain. Both partial unity and fast switching between one and two minds are so interesting from a philosophical point of view, so interesting in principle, that more space might have been devoted to them in a book with this level of detail. That said, Schechter's book is a detailed, careful attempt to get to the bottom of the way the human split-brain phenomenon actually is. The result is a very valuable book indeed.


Bayne, T. (2005). "Divided Brains & Unified Phenomenology: A Review Essay on Michael Tye's Consciousness and Persons." Philosophical Psychology 18: 495-512.

Downey, A. (2018). "Split-brain syndrome and extended perceptual consciousness." Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences 17: 787-811.

Lockwood, M. (1989). Mind, Brain and the Quantum. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.

Hurley, S. (1998). Consciousness in Action. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

Marchetti, C, and S Della Sala (1998). "Disentangling the Alien and Anarchic Hand." Cognitive Neuropsychiatry 3:3: 191-207.

Marks, C. (1981). Commissurotomy, Consciousness, and the Unity of Mind. Cambridge: Bradford Books (MIT Press).

Nagel, T. (1971). "Brain Bisection and the Unity of Consciousness." Synthese 22: 396-413.

Schaefer M, Denke C, Apostolova I, Heinze H-J and Galazky I (2016). "A Case of Right Alien Hand Syndrome Coexisting with Right-Sided Tactile Extinction." Frontiers in Human Neuroscience 10:105.

Schechter, E. (2014). "Partial Unity of Consciousness: A Preliminary Defense," in Sensory Integration and the Unity of Consciousness, ed. D. Bennett and C. Hill. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Tye, M. (2003). Consciousness and Persons. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

[1] See Schaefer et al. (2016) for a case and for comments on right versus left. Marchetti and Della Sala (1998) distinguish "anarchic" from "alien" hand, with the former being a motor problem and the latter involving a sense of ownership. Other literature does not always follow this terminology, and some cases are also described as involving both problems. I am grateful to Dominic Murphy for discussion of these phenomena.

[2] Bayne and Downey argue that earlier attempts to countenance fast switching of this kind, such as the view of Marks (1981) and Tye (2003), would be hard to fill out without vehicle externalism.