Self-Defense, Necessity, and Punishment: A Philosophical Analysis

Self Defense Necessity And Punishment A Philosophical Analysis Book Cover

Uwe Steinhoff, Self-Defense, Necessity, and Punishment: A Philosophical Analysis, Routledge, 2020, 369pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367407216.

Reviewed by Kimberly Kessler Ferzan, University of Pennsylvania


Uwe Steinhoff is an excellent philosopher. He is analytically exacting, wide ranging, and steeped in many of the central debates. He is also an important critic of the dominant strains of discussion within just war theory. Unfortunately, the book does not live up to Steinhoff's promise as a theorist. Although there are some insightful interventions in current debates, the monograph fails to present a clear and coherent vision. Ultimately, it is best read for some of its pieces, as the whole is less than the sum of its parts.

To begin with, the book is simply an unpleasant read. There is an evident frustration with other philosophers: Steinhoff gets no farther than the second paragraph of his preface before attacking "a group of just war theorists who like to call themselves, 'revisionists'" (ix). And so, from the very first page, this is a book that is presented as ire at the work of others rather than a thorough and cohesive view of Steinhoff's.

This has two specific implications for the reader. The first is tone. Some portions of the book are jarring. For instance, Steinhoff responds to an argument by one philosopher with a one-word sentence: "Wrong" (314). To be sure, it is helpful to know what is incoherent, implausible, and a non-sequitur, but at times the degree of vitriol is hard for a reader (even one who reads substantial amounts of exacting philosophy) to bear.

The second implication is the presentation of the material. The trouble arises because Steinhoff's constant injection of others' arguments (and the previous debates he has had with them and what they have said about his view) just leads to one complicated argument after another. It is too dense, and there are too many rabbit holes. There is just the sense that Steinhoff read other people's work, dashed off three pages of why he thought each philosopher was a complete idiot, and then stapled all the pages together and added a few paragraphs here and there to bind the book together. Rarely does Steinhoff straightforwardly present his view. I think the book would be unapproachable for someone not already steeped in the debates.

This is unfortunate because it seems that Steinhoff has novel insights and new connections. And yet I never got the full sense of how Steinhoff's conception of the emergency justification (Chapter Four) relates to self-defense (Chapter Two). Steinhoff's conception of self-defense, which he believes conceptually entails imminence, is backstopped by a more generous emergency justification that allows one to act against non-imminent threats (45). Though this is apparently a distinction that exists within German law, it is not a feature of U.S. law (as Steinhoff knows, 45), and I would have liked to learn exactly how these two interact. But there are so many intricate and distracting arguments that it is difficult to find the thread that explains precisely what is doing the moral work in distinguishing these two defenses, which Steinhoff maintains are conceptually distinct.

Still, the question remains whether those who are well versed in self-defense theory should read the book. Here, my answer is a tentative yes. There are fruitful lines of argument and analysis. For instance, Steinhoff calls attention to the problem with an objective necessity requirement. As a forfeiture theorist, I would put the concern this way: Even if a culpable aggressor threatening deadly force does forfeit rights against deadly force, there is no reason to impose deadly force in return. That is, deadly force by a self-defender is never actually necessary -- the defender could scream just the right thing, duck at just the right moment, shoot her gun so that the bullet's trajectory just grazes the aggressor's hand and causes him to drop the gun, and so forth (174-81). And a reasonable belief requirement does not resolve the problem because the defender does not mistakenly believe her way is the best way. Rather, she recognizes that, given her epistemic limitations, this is the best she can do. Steinhoff sees this problem as further support for the view that moral justifications cannot be fact-relative, as they are then not action guiding (181). To be sure, moral philosophers have seen this debate before in different guises, but Steinhoff's elucidation of just how problematic an objective necessity requirement is, and how current theorists fail to resolve the problem, is one of the best in the literature.

Overall, the coverage and cohesiveness of the book's general topics is quite good. After a brief introduction, Chapter Two takes on the entire cornucopia of self-defense issues -- necessity, proportionality, imminence, and the subjective element. Chapter Three takes on some special cases -- non-responsible threats and justified aggressors. Chapter Four discusses the emergency justification, and Chapter Five discusses the public authority justification. Notably, the book is not about all types of necessity arguments -- criminal law theorists looking for their standard prison escape cases, discussions of civil disobedience, or queries about torture will find that these are lacking -- nor is it about all of punishment (rather it focuses almost exclusively on Kit Wellman's argument about why the state has the exclusive right to punish). Hence, both necessity and punishment are discussed only in service to their relationship to self-defense, forfeiture, and justifications. Though the title is a bit misleading for those who want broad discussions, the result is a far more topically focused monograph than the title might suggest. All the subjects within the book are also well worth discussing and addressing together.

Nevertheless, there are ways in which the focus is both too dense and too thin. Steinhoff spends significant amounts of time on the discussion of whether there should be a success condition for self-defense, and whether justified aggressors may be liable to defensive force. The former debate often centers around whether a rape victim may justifiably break the wrist of her attacker if that action will not stop the attack, and the latter typically asks whether civilians who will be killed as a side-effect of a justified bombing may shoot down the pilot. To be sure, these are important questions, but they also narrow the discussions in the book. In contrast to these frequent engagement with revisionists' arguments, Steinhoff seems to miss other arguments in the literature that contradict his views, including failing to engage the difficult questions of public authority that Heidi Hurd's Moral Combat raises for his view (341),[1] or the intermediate position for justifications suggested by Antony Duff's concept of "warranted behavior" (see 302).[2] Steinhoff also purports to be relying on the widely shared intuitions inherent within the criminal law (ix, 17, 19), but will sometimes jettison laws he disagrees with (33, 36, 126, 213 n.226), and fails to consistently tie his work to the criminal law's construction of the defense in a way that would bind the argument together.

For the remainder of my review, I will address one central claim of Steinhoff's. He does not believe that we wrong individuals if we employ unnecessary defensive force. Instead, the necessity limitation comes from a "precautionary principle" -- namely, you can never be sure you are not harming an innocent aggressor (67). That is, if someone culpably tries to kill you, and you know you can stop him by pinching him, punching him, or even pummeling him, but you instead opt to kill him, you do not wrong him. Instead, your action is unjustified because you may be incorrect about the facts -- it may be that your attacker is actually innocent (drugged, for example) and so would be wronged by unnecessary force. But you do not wrong culpable aggressors by using unnecessary force.

Intuitions may cut both ways on this one. On the one hand, Steinhoff frequently invokes the argument, "Look who's talking," to argue that those who culpably intend to kill others have no legitimate complaint if someone kills them (e.g., 76, 83, 90, 151). On the other hand, Jon Quong begins a discussion of the necessity requirement with the idea that the police officer who uses unnecessary force wrongs the aggressor.[3] Now, Steinhoff may be able to have his cake and eat it too by arguing that there is something special about the role of law enforcement, but we ought to concede that intuitions about whether the aggressor is wronged can be pumped from either side.

I am more interested, however, in what lies beneath "Look who's talking." Steinhoff uses this phrase repeatedly in the book. And with it, he invokes both the concepts of reciprocity and hypocrisy (92, 93, 152).[4] Although Steinhoff runs these together, I take them to be distinct claims. A reciprocity claim, as I take Steinhoff to be defining it, is the idea that rights exist because of a mutual agreement to respect each other's interests. When reciprocity does not exist, the interest is not respected as a right. In contrast, hypocrisy claims are typically standing claims. That is, given that the complainer has committed the very same transgression, he lacks the standing to complain. I worry, though, that Steinhoff's reciprocity claim is too strong, and a claim of hypocrisy is too weak to do the work Steinhoff wants it to do.

Let's consider Steinhoff's reciprocity argument. Steinhoff thinks that a natural implication of a reciprocity account is that if you aim to kill me, then I do not wrong you by shooting you, even if I know that I could just step on your toe. By having tried to kill me, you are no longer entitled to my respecting your interests as rights.

But Steinhoff takes this further. Once there is a loss of reciprocity, it is in rem. If you try to hit me, then not only may I hit you, but so too may Peter, Paul, and Mary (93). Let's be clear: Peter, Paul, Mary, and I may all hit you because you no longer have rights against being hit. Anyone may hit you.[5]

Your forfeiture is limited to proportionate harms (91). What is proportionate? This too is dependent on a similar "Look who's talking" argument, and there, Steinhoff takes reciprocity to be a predisposition (151). So, I may shoot you for stealing my apple, if you would shoot me for stealing yours (150).[6] Indeed, if you go around merely promoting the idea that all apple thieves should be hung, then you too will not be wronged for being hung for stealing an apple (152). Combining Steinhoff's conception of proportionality with his construal of necessity should yield the implication that if you are stealing an apple, and you have lawn signs that advocate, "Maim the apple thieves!" then not only the apple owner, but Peter, Paul, and Mary may maim you.

Such a broad view of reciprocity, however, strikes me as potentially being a double-edged sword. If A is out of the social contract, not only with B, but also with C, D, and E, so that now C, D, and E are not bound against harming A proportionately to his initial transgression, then should we worry that A is also out of the contract? And if this is true, then won't A be free to hurt C, D, and E because he is no longer bound to respect their rights? That is, if what protects us is an idea of reciprocity, and reciprocity breaks down, then we must worry that A can no longer wrong anyone. If your actions free you from the reciprocal respect of your interests as rights then it seems that after hitting or trying to hit me, you no longer wrong anyone by hitting them. You are out of the bounds of reciprocity, so just as you cannot be wronged, you cannot commit a wrong either.

Now, it strikes me as implausible that there is a complete free-for-all against you in which Peter, Paul, and Mary may all permissibly hit you (and this is implausible not just because I take them to be folk singing pacifists). But it strikes me as even more implausible that after trying to hit me, you would not wrong any other random persons, say Larry, Moe, and Curly, by hitting them because the reciprocity has broken down. Maybe Steinhoff has something more limited in mind, but it is not clear how he plans to ground it and he does not address this potential implication of his view.

Still, there is a truth to "Look who's talking." It does seem that the aggressor lacks standing to complain. But there are ways to lose one's standing to complain without losing the underlying right.[7] This is readily apparent in the law, and Steinhoff takes the law as importantly informing our arguments. For instance, consider provocateurs.[8] Someone who intentionally provokes a deadly attack loses the right to defend herself, but the person who harms the provocateur still commits a criminal offense. So, you can be wronged and yet not have a right to defend yourself. Or, take estoppel.[9] Here, based on particular representations, one can lose the right to sue despite the fact that one was wronged by the underlying action. What we can glean from these legal positions is that we can finely grain forfeitures in such a way that "Look who's talking" can have moral purchase without amounting to a complete loss of rights by the aggressor. Perhaps Steinhoff can ground this loss in hypocrisy. Nevertheless, if hypocrisy can entail that one lacks standing to complain, this does not mean that hypocrisy can easily be extended to the claim that one is not wronged by the underlying action without further argument.

Ultimately, readers may find examining Steinhoff's interventions in various debates to be useful in helping them to scrutinize carefully assumptions that they are making or their standard approaches to problems. But a work that clearly and crisply sets forth Steinhoff's vision of self-defense and related claims will have to await future publication.


[1] Heidi M. Hurd, Moral Combat (Cambridge University Press, 1999).

[2] Antony Duff, "Rethinking Justifications," Tulsa Law Review, 39 (2004): 829-50.

[3] Jonathan Quong, The Morality of Defensive Force (Oxford University Press, 2020), 125.

[4] E.g., 92 (noting that someone employing unnecessary force could say, "So who are you to complain? You are a damn hypocrite").

[5] Steinhoff says that an aggressor regains her rights when she is subjected to proportionate punishment (and it must be punishment and not beating someone up for fun) and the aggressor makes "an honest decision not to beat people up again" (93).

[6] On this point, he relies on David Rodin's notion of "counterfactual reciprocal compliance" (150). David Rodin, "The Reciprocity Theory of Rights," Law and Philosophy 33 (2014): 281-308.

[7] This slicing of a right is something Steinhoff himself does elsewhere in the monograph (59).

[8] Kimberly Kessler Ferzan, "Provocateurs," Criminal Law and Philosophy 7 (2013): 597-622; Model Penal Code § 3.04(2)(b)(i).

[9] Kimberly Kessler Ferzan, "Losing the Right to Assert You've Been Wrong: A Study in Conceptual Chaos?" in Paul B. Miller and John Oberdiek, eds., Civil Wrongs and Justice in Private Law (Oxford University Press, 2020): 111-129.