Self-Knowing Agents

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Lucy O'Brien, Self-Knowing Agents, Oxford University Press, 2007, 231pp., $63.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199261482.

Reviewed by Robert J. Howell, Southern Methodist University


In Self-Knowing Agents Lucy O'Brien accounts for some of the most perplexing features of first-personal self-knowledge by appealing to our awareness of ourselves as agents of mental and physical acts.  This is difficult territory, as likely to lead one to hand-waving generalities as to forest-blind technicalities.  O'Brien negotiates it excellently, providing a theory that is both well situated in historical debates and well motivated by the sorts of things we care about.  This book will be must reading for those interested in the sort of privileged access marked by the "essential indexical" as well as for those interested in non-Cartesian views that allow a sort of privileged access to bodily actions.  I can also see it being of interest to anyone interested in action theory, epistemology and philosophy of mind in general.

O'Brien divides the book into two parts.  In the first, she discusses the problems of first-person reference and offers her "agency account" as a solution to them.  In the second part, O'Brien extends her account to explain the particular, first-personal way that we can come to know our own bodily actions.


First-person reference has several distinguishing features.  Such reference is guaranteed, has an irreducible cognitive significance, and is "identification free" in that it can be secured in the absence of independent avenues of identifying the referent.  These peculiarities have led some, most notably Anscombe, to claim that "I" is ultimately not a referring term.  In chapter two, O'Brien clearly formulates the arguments behind this view -- an effort rarely made -- and finds them wanting.  She does not, however, think that we can simply ignore the important disanalogies between self-reference and other types of reference that are perceptually grounded.  Thus in chapter three she considers several versions of the "perceptual model," focusing on that of Gareth Evans.  O'Brien argues that such models will be unable to provide the guaranteed reference that characterizes first-personal thoughts, simply because first-personal reference seems to survive the loss of the relevant perceptual information no matter how that information is construed.

One of the book's most valuable contributions comes in chapter four, which explains why the problem of self-reference cannot be solved simply by noting that the use of the first-person indexical is governed by a self-reference rule (SRR) which states that "I" refers to the person who uses it.  O'Brien explains that while such rules do govern the use of "I," this fact alone cannot solve the puzzles surrounding first-person reference.  The reason is that these puzzles gain traction not because "I" is linguistically perplexing but because some of its uses reflect a basic sort of self-consciousness:  the consciousness of oneself as oneself.  O'Brien argues that while it is the case that any subject who uses a term knowing that it is governed by SRR will succeed in referring in a first-personal manner, it can still be asked why such a subject will always refer self-consciously.

O'Brien's answer is that when we make judgments -- including judgments employing terms governed by SRR -- we have an awareness of ourselves as agents making those judgments, and it is this awareness that grounds first-personal consciousness and therefore first-person reference.  This explains self-reference because "a subject who uses 'I' in accordance with SRR, and who has agent's awareness of what she is doing, thereby simultaneously refers to herself first-personally and is able to know that she is so referring." (77)

The agent awareness view does have an intuitive appeal.  If one takes seriously the need to spell out the nature of self-consciousness, one will eventually appeal to a basic sort of awareness, and there does seem to be an awareness we enjoy as the originators of our judgments and actions that is independent of the awareness we have of the judgments and actions themselves.  (If one doubts this, one can think about cases of "thought insertion" where individuals -- usually schizophrenics -- have thoughts that, according to them, are being "spoken into their heads" by unknown interlopers.  There is a phenomenology associated with the sense of authorship that is surely lacking in such cases.)  The identification of oneself as an object seems precisely the wrong way to ground self-consciousness, so agential awareness is a natural explanation of how we know ourselves as ourselves.  Nevertheless, O'Brien realizes that this won't go far without a further explanation.  The final chapter of part one aims to provide such an explanation, focusing on our awareness of our own thoughts.

O'Brien's view is that in making judgments, one exercises a rational control over one's mental actions that provides a representation-independent awareness of oneself:

I want to suggest that having this kind of control over one's mental life provides a primitive, representationally independent kind of awareness of what one is doing, and that this awareness is agent's awareness.  For a subject to have rational control over her mental life she must have the capacity to assess possibilities available to her, and be able immediately to act on such assessments.    The core suggestion is that the very idea of an action produced by an active assessment by an agent, carries with it the idea of an assessment by an agent of actions for her.  For a subject to engage in an assessment of what to do is for a subject to determine what she should do.  The suggestion then is that any action produced directly on the basis of an active assessment by an agent will be an action of which the agent is aware of as hers. (117)

Everything O'Brien says here sounds very plausible, and it has the virtue of linking her discussion of self-reference to discussions of first-person authority (such as those by Moran and Bilgrami) that ground privileged access in the normative commitment we have to our own beliefs and decisions.  Nevertheless, I think there is some reason to question whether her analysis sheds much light on self-consciousness and in particular whether the "agential" part of the self-consciousness is doing much work.

According to O'Brien, there are two features of mental actions such that an agent is immediately entitled to self-attribute the action:

1.  Agent's awareness

The act produced by a process of considering what to do is a conscious act -- one of which the subject is agent aware -- and there is a general entitlement immediately to self-ascribe those states and activities of hers that are conscious.

2.  Rational connections between actions and self-ascriptions

A subject is rationally entitled to self-ascribe an act carried out on the basis of a consideration of how to act because of rational connections between the nature and pre-suppositions of her act and her self-ascription. (119)

Two questions arise for this account.  One is why the entitlement mentioned in the first part isn't sufficient.  Another is whether that entitlement is specifically agential.  It seems that if one has entitlement to self-ascribe one's conscious acts, that is all one needs to secure self-consciousness -- the rational connections between one's self-ascriptions and one's actions seem irrelevant to basic self-consciousness or the grounding of self-reference.  More importantly, given that one is entitled to self-ascribe one's conscious states as well as one's conscious acts, it seems that what is really doing the work is the simple fact that one is entitled to self-ascribe one's conscious states in general and that acts are just particular instances of that entitlement.

In fact, I think there is reason to believe that agential awareness must presuppose a more basic self-awareness.  Following a suggestion by Moran, O'Brien explains the entitlement behind agent's awareness as follows:  "a subject who self-ascribes an action she carries out guided by her consideration of what is true is entitled to take the action to be hers, because hers are the only actions that can be carried out immediately on the basis of such consideration." (119)  But are hers the only actions that can be carried out immediately on the basis of such consideration?  That depends on what "such consideration" means in this context.  Someone else could, of course, be going through exactly similar deliberations and their actions can be carried out immediately on the basis of those deliberations.  But that is not really what Moran and O'Brien mean by "such considerations."  They mean "considerations that she is consciously making."  That is why only her actions are immediately connected to her deliberations.  But then it seems as though her entitlement to self-ascribe the action depends upon her grasp of her conscious deliberations and her conscious grasp that those deliberations are hers.  Why is she entitled to self-ascribe her deliberations?  One almost irresistible hypothesis is that it is when those deliberations are conscious there is no question as to whether or not they are hers, just as when she is in pain there is no question as to whether or not the pain is hers.  But if this is the case, it seems the entitlement conferred by consciousness is basic, not agent consciousness after all.

Despite the preceding worry, I think O'Brien has offered a view that increases our understanding of self-reference and self-consciousness.  Even if more needs to be done to show the independence of the agential account from other, consciousness based accounts, O'Brien's treatment pushes the debate forward and brings a well articulated new perspective to the table.


In the second part of the book, O'Brien turns her attention to the privileged access we have to our bodies and our bodily actions.  Though I find myself wanting more from the arguments and positions in these chapters, I think O'Brien's views here are provocative and deserve serious consideration.  Contrary to recent trends, she grounds all privileged self-knowledge in psychological self-knowledge.  She resists Cartesianism, however, by claiming that physical actions are ultimately psychological phenomena.  Though I myself remain somewhat unconvinced, this is an attractive way to avoid throwing the baby out with the Cartesian bathwater.

Chapter eight is an essay on the ontology of actions.  This is a large topic to cover in a mere twenty-five pages, and O'Brien is aware of being a bit quick.  Her thesis is that actions are not "metaphysical hybrids," each one including a purely physical part and a purely mental part, glued together by causation.  Instead, she maintains that actions constitute "primitive unities."  O'Brien argues for this in much the same way that Timothy Williamson argues for the claim that knowledge is a basic state that resists analysis into a conjunction of component parts.  Just as the analysis of knowledge is problematized by counterexamples involving deviant evidential chains, so the analysis of action is problematized by deviant causal chains connecting intention and action.  So, O'Brien spurns the attempt to analyze actions as a misguided project and urges that we take the notion of action as primitive.

I am not O'Brien's ideal reader here because I find this sort of argument perplexing, not only because of the invalidity of arguments from pessimism, but also because the pessimistic "unitarians" often go on to provide "explications" of the unanalysable notions.  In the end, however, I'm not sure it matters that I'm not on board with the project in chapter eight, because there is little in the following chapters that depends upon it.

O'Brien's goal in chapter nine is to provide an account of our first-personal access to our own actions.  When a subject performs an action, she has authoritative knowledge that she has acted and that she has performed the particular action she has performed.  This knowledge is unusual not only because it reflects epistemic authority, but also because this authority does not stem from a perception of the action.  O'Brien makes a good case that we do have this sort of privileged access, at least to basic actions -- actions a subject can perform without having to do anything else.  She explains this access once again in terms of agent-awareness.

O'Brien says that one has this sort of self-awareness when one acts with a sense of control.  "An agent acts with a sense of control when she carries out her action on the basis of an assessment of the possibilities, grasped as possibilities, of acting one way rather than another." (185)  If an agent acts in such a manner, it will not be an open question whether she is the author of the action, and it will not be an open question what the action is.  Acting on the basis of a grasp of the possibilities for acting will simply bring that further knowledge in tow.  This is because her "active evaluation only makes sense on the assumption that she is determining what she should do and in actively evaluating her … choices the agent manifests awareness that these are … ways she can act." (185)

Though this sounds correct as a story about our knowledge of our own actions, I am ultimately not sure what to make of it as an explanation of that privileged access.  One can evaluate possible actions without evaluating them as possibilities for one's own action:  decision theory is a discipline based on that possibility.  One can also evaluate a set of possibilities and then move as a result of that evaluation:  more than once, for example, I've scratched my head in confusion when considering problems in decision theory.  This can be done unconsciously and without any special sort of self-knowledge.  This is not a counterexample to O'Brien's account, because two important features are missing:  I am not considering the possibilities as possibilities for my action, and I am not basing my action on that consideration in the appropriate way.  What is it to consider possibilities as possibilities for my action as opposed to mere possibilities for action?  O'Brien does not really focus on this question, but her account appears incomplete without answering it.  Even were this question answered, a gap would remain, however, because I can clearly behave as a result of my contemplating the possibilities for my action without that behavior being something I am conscious of as one of my actions:  I could unconsciously scratch my head when I face a moral dilemma, for example.  I have no authority in this case because when I scratch my head I am not consciously basing my action on my consideration of my possibilities.  An explanation of our privileged access to our own actions would have to explain what this "conscious basing" involves and such an explanation is not forthcoming.  Of course not every analysis needs to be fully reductive.  One can advance understanding even if one's explanans is in need of some explaining.  The problem here is that the unexplained explanans looks very similar to the original explanandum.  That is, "consciously basing bodily movements upon possibilities" seems less of an analysis or explanation of "acting with first-personal knowledge" than a different way of saying the same thing.  All of the original mysteries seem intact under different headings.

In the final two chapters, O'Brien discusses the peculiar nature of the awareness we have of our own bodies.  Chapter ten suggests that we model our understanding of bodily perception upon our understanding of the perception of secondary qualities.  My feeling a pain in my foot can be analyzed into a structure not unlike that of my seeing the brownness on my desk.  Pains and tickles, on her view, can be seen as "perceptible properties of parts of our bodies discriminable by bodily awareness." (195)  Thus, "when I feel a tickle or pain in my arm … I perceive my arm, and perceive it as being tickly or painy at a certain location." (195)  This is a suggestive view, and I personally find it rather attractive.  Nevertheless, there could be much deeper discussion of the parallels between secondary quality perception and bodily perception.  Can we comprehend an equivalent of spectral inversion in the case of bodily experience?  It seems plausible that our intuitions about bodily perception in various thought experiments might not map neatly onto our intuitions about secondary qualities.  In the final chapter, O'Brien discusses the particular security possessed by bodily awareness.  Her main thesis is that though bodily awareness can, perhaps, count as privileged in some way, it cannot constitute the basic awareness we have of ourselves because it is ultimately perceptual.  Agent-awareness remains basic.  O'Brien argues persuasively that even if modes of bodily awareness such as proprioception happen to present a single object to a subject as her body, this is not a necessary fact.  In a world where one's proprioceptive sense was regularly wired up to detect the situation of different bodies, one could not use that sense to provide knowledge of the situation of one's own body.  When we act using our own bodies, however, we do gain such basic knowledge.  She summarizes her view as follows:

What appears critical to making bodily awareness of a body, awareness of a body as mine, is my ability to act with that body.  In the absence of action the sense of ownership can, I suggest, recede, and given multiple access … and knowledge of the possibility of such access, what will secure for me that the body I am aware of is mine is that this is the body that responds to my will. (217)

Again, one suspects that the debates about this issue could extend well beyond the confines of this chapter.  Nevertheless, O'Brien's view is plausible, interesting, and rather neatly tied into the rest of her views about awareness of the body and awareness of bodily actions.

Overall, Self-Knowing Agents is a book well worth studying.  It covers a wide range of interesting and difficult problems, and even where its solutions fail to convince, they do not fail to provoke.  Its two sections -- the first on self-reference and the second on the knowledge of bodily action -- are both valuable, but for different reasons.  The first contains a top-notch discussion of a difficult problem, concluding with an original solution.  The second covers a larger range of problems with slightly less depth, but with a keen eye for interesting debates and inventive positions.  Though the second part becomes sketchy at times, O'Brien cannot be blamed too much for this, as the literature on bodily awareness and privileged access to bodily actions is less developed in general.  It is to her credit that she spurs that literature forward and gestures at a way in which these two problems might yield to a similar approach.