Self-Knowledge and Resentment

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Akeel Bilgrami, Self-Knowledge and Resentment, Harvard University Press, 2006, 396pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0674022890.

Reviewed by Dorit Bar-On, University of North Carolina, Chapel Hill


The stated aim of Akeel Bilgrami's Self-Knowledge and Resentment is to offer an account of self-knowledge which preserves the intuition that our knowledge of some of our intentional states is, as he puts it, "special among all the knowledges we have".  In the opening chapter, Bilgrami captures this intuition in terms of a pair of presumptions that separate self-knowledge from other kinds of knowledge (most notably, perceptual knowledge).  They are:

(T) Transparency: If S desires (believes) that p, then S believes that she desires (believes) that p; and

(A) Authority: If S believes that she desires (believes) that p, then she desires (believes) that p.

Adopting what he calls an 'integrative strategy', Bilgrami hopes to show that (T) and (A) hold of self-knowledge not only presumptively, but as a matter of conceptual necessity, which he thinks can only be captured by a thoroughly constitutive account of self-knowledge.  Self-knowledge, on this constitutive account, "is not an epistemological notion in the standard sense".  Rather, it is "a fallout of the radically normative nature of thought and agency" -- the fact that "we are creatures with responsibility and with states of mind properly described in radically normative terms and not merely as motives and dispositions" (p. xiii).  On Bilgrami's account, self-knowledge emerges as knowledge we inevitably have of states the very nature of which is bound up with being known by us.  Recognizing this, Bilgrami thinks, requires nothing less than a reconceptualization of the self-known intentional states in thoroughly non-naturalistic 'value-laden' terms, as commitments.  (The contrast here is with intentional states conceived as causally-functionally specified internal states of the sort we can plausibly be thought to share with non-human animals and very young children.)  Once the reconceptualization is achieved, the book's larger ambition can come into focus.  This is the ambition of 'integrating' four major philosophical themes, tied to the perennial attempt to find a place for value, free action, intentionality, and privileged self-knowledge in an objectively understood natural world.

The book is neatly structured.  Chapter 1 presents the claims of transparency and authority ((T) and (A) above) and gives some of Bilgrami's reasons for thinking that no perceptual or inferential account of self-knowledge can give them appropriate weight.  Chapters 2 and 3 offer the 'conceptual basis' for transparency, and chapters 4 and 5 do the same for authority.  Chapter 6 offers a summary and draws out some broader implications of the book's view.  The book concludes with two appendices.  The first one is titled "A Short Essay on Psychoanalysis".  It presents Bilgrami's take on the relation between self-knowledge as understood by the constitutive view he defends and the by-now-familiar cases where self-knowledge seems to fail, or to require self-investigation and third-person insight.  The second one briefly suggests a 'reorientation' of the debate between externalists and internalists concerning reasons for action in light of Bilgrami's portrayal of intentional states as commitments.

The 'integrative strategy' that Bilgrami adopts is not easy to fit into familiar molds favored by some contemporary analytic philosophers.  Bilgrami self-consciously refuses to be held hostage to the restrictive demands of conceptual analysis, metaphysical reduction, theoretical, causal or naturalistic explanation, or noncircular deductive argument (see e.g. the 'note of caution' on p. 47 and the meta­philosophical remarks on pages 61f., 67, 126f., 130ff., 178f., 293f., as well as various disclaimers peppered throughout the book).  Bilgrami favors instead explication of key notions and defense of his main theses through 'integration', 'elucidation', and 'illumination by fitting into a network of integral relations' among concepts.  Such preference is not without precedent among venerable analytic philosophers.  I am reminded in particular of Peter Strawson's plea (in his 1992 Analysis and Metaphysics) for replacing reductive conceptual analysis with conceptual elucidation as the basic tool of philosophizing.  Unlike reduction, elucidation does not aim to explicate problematic concepts by decomposing them into allegedly simpler, unproblematic elements.  Rather, it attempts to identify, in Strawson's words, "general, pervasive, and ultimately irreducible" components in "a structure which constitutes the framework of our ordinary thought and talk and which is presupposed by [our theories]" (op. cit., p. 24).

This seems to me the appropriate light in which to see Self-Knowledge and Resentment, especially given that Bilgrami locates the origins of one of the book's key ideas in Strawson's celebrated article "Freedom and Resentment" (the inspiration for the title of Bilgrami's book and the topic of Chapter 2).  The idea in question is that "[s]elf-knowledge is a necessary condition for agency; and intentionality as it figures in agency therefore must be transparent" (p. 99).  It may be helpful (and hopefully not in violation of the spirit of 'elucidation') to spell out the connection Bilgrami sees between freedom and special self-knowledge in terms of the following argument:

(1) Free actions are ones that we can be held responsible for.

(2) We can only be held responsible for an action if we have special self-knowledge of what we're doing (i.e., what action we're performing).

(3) We only have special self-knowledge of our actions if we have such knowledge of the intentional states that rationalize the actions.


(FàSSK) Special self-knowledge of the intentional states that rationalize our actions is necessary for their being free.

Premise 1 represents Strawson's 'normative conception of freedom' on a reading Bilgrami presents in Chapter 2.  Subsequent chapters can then be seen as trying to establish the truth of premises 2 & 3 of the master argument with respect to both transparency and authority.

The above argument, even if successful, does not of course establish that we do in fact possess special self-knowledge.  To get this conclusion we'd need to incorporate (FàSSK) into a 'transcendental' argument such as the following:

Transcendental argument from freedom to special self-knowledge:

(F) (At least some of) our actions are free.

(FàSSK) Special self-knowledge of the intentional states that rationalize our actions is necessary for their being free.


(SSK) We have special self-knowledge (of the intentional states that rationalize our actions).

Some philosophers may worry about trying to support the very-hard-to-deny claim that we possess special self-knowledge (however this is to be explained) by appeal to the more seemingly dubitable claim that some of our actions are genuinely free (even in Strawson's more specialized normative sense).  But Bilgrami may not be as concerned to argue for (F) as he is to establish a conceptual connection between the ordinary notion of special self-knowledge and free agency.  Given that, it is worth exploring another reading of what Bilgrami is up to, one that does not rely on the claim that we are free agents (in Strawson's sense) as a step in an argument that we must possess special self-knowledge.

On the alternative reading, the defense of special self-knowledge is only to be modeled after Strawson's defense of freedom.  Just as the defender of freedom must rebut those considerations that seem to show that all our actions are determined, so the defender of special self-knowledge must rebut those considerations that seem to show that we are self-ignorant or self-deceived.  Both defenders want to save certain appearances (the intuitive 'data'): that we often perform free actions (for which we can held responsible, be blamed/praised resented, etc.) in the one case; that we often have secure, non-inferential, non-observational knowledge of our states of mind, in the other case.  These appearances seem threatened if we adopt an objective, scientifically-minded point of view on ourselves.  Ordinary pronouncements of freedom seem threatened when we think of our actions as causally determined events in the physical world.  Similarly, our pronouncements of secure self-knowledge may seem threatened if we think of our states of mind as 'independently existent' physical states inside our bodies.  The pessimist in each case wants to argue that certain scientific findings/metaphysical observations generalize and simply illustrate what is true of all of us: that e.g. like the addict, all of us ultimately can't help but do what we do, or like the Freudian patient or the subject in the cognitive science lab, we may all be deeply self-ignorant or self-deceived.  The committed optimist, on the other hand, wants to insist that the illustrative cases are pathologies; they cannot seriously threaten our ordinary confidence that we possess freedom of action/secure self-knowledge; at most they can point to local, exceptional failures (of freedom/self-knowledge).  And many optimists want to insist that this is so not merely contingently -- so that, no matter what science (or metaphysics) discovers, it cannot in the end turn out that we don't after all possess any freedom/special self-knowledge.  Rather, basic freedom/self-knowledge is something we necessarily possess.

But how could that be?  Naively, if the question of freedom is a purely factual matter, completely settled by an objective contingent reality, then our a priori confidence about our own freedom cannot, it seems, be warranted.  Similarly, if the question of what someone wants, thinks, believes, etc. at a given time is a purely factual matter, objectively settled by, say, what state her brain (or brain plus environment) is at that time, then our a priori confidence that we are guaranteed to have direct knowledge of our states of mind is also ungrounded.  Now, Strawson (on Bilgrami's reading) has shown us the way out of the conundrum in the case of freedom: deny that attributions of freedom are purely descriptive attributions, held hostage to an independent objective reality.  Instead, we are to think of such attributions as 'normative', value-laden moves embedded in a rich set of practices and conditioned by our reactive attitudes.  On the present reading, we are to take Bilgrami as making an analogous proposal regarding self-knowledge.  Attributions of special self-knowledge, on the 'normative' view, are not purely descriptive claims that involve crediting agents with standing in a certain epistemic relation to independently existing states that just happen to be states of their own minds.  Rather, such attributions are part and parcel of attributions of intentional states, just as attributions of freedom are part and parcel of attributions of responsibility, as well as proper assessments of reactive attitudes.

Crudely put, just as your action can be said to be free (or something you have intentionally done) only if you can be held responsible for it (and if it's appropriate to blame/resent you for it), so too you can be said to have a belief (or a belief can be said to be your belief) only if you can be regarded as have privileged access to it.  That your having a belief requires your believing that you do, and believing that you have a belief implies that you have it (so both Transparency and Authority hold).  Once this idea is in place, we can perhaps go on to show that deviant cases (of causally determined actions, in the one case, or self-ignorant/deceived beliefs, in the other) are only to be understood against the conceptually necessary standard (of freedom, or self-knowledge).  In both cases, we can accommodate apparent counterexamples to the normative-conceptual claim through the formula: "to the extent that A is my action I can be held responsible for it (and vice versa); to the extent that B is my belief, I can be said to believe that I have it (and vice versa)".

Although much of Bilgrami's discussion (and see especially some of the caveats in the concluding chapter) seems in line with the more modest constitutive view just expounded, he evidently wants to maintain a stronger view according to which we can only have free agency if we possess self-knowledge of our intentional states.  (Bilgrami also wants to establish the provocative converse claim, that free agency is necessary, as well as sufficient, for self-knowledge of intentional states.  This is the upshot of the lengthy discussion on pp.160ff of Oblomov, the benighted chronically inactive subject, who can ultimately only be said to be 'assailed' by belief- and desire-like states, but lacks genuine intentionality.)  Notice, however, that even if Bilgrami's stronger view is correct, it establishes conceptual connections between free action and self-knowledge of only those intentional states that serve to rationalize our actions.

Bilgrami sets aside from the outset self-knowledge of non-intentional, phenomenal states, and even sets aside a wide class of intentional states.  His explicit focus is on "knowledge of our intentional and propositionally specified states of mind", and even among those he restricts himself "to the more canonical such states -- beliefs and desires, mainly -- and not the entire range of intentional states" (p. 1).  As the defense of special self-knowledge unfolds, however, it turns out that the focus must be narrower still.  For the normative conception of intentional states urged by Bilgrami (in the course of arguing that as free agents we must have knowledge of our intentional states) really only applies to beliefs and desires understood as our reasons for action.  Behind Bilgrami's defense of Transparency and Authority as unqualifiedly true lies the idea that free agency (understood via Strawson's normative conception) requires knowledge of what one is doing, and knowing what one is doing is knowing the reasons for which one is acting, and thus the intentions, beliefs and desires, with which one is acting.  But this means that his line of defense at most applies to our knowledge of intentional states insofar as those are caught up in rational explanations of action.  Thus it turns out that the constitutive account on offer does not ultimately help establish Transparency and Authority with respect to our sensations, feelings, emotions, and even occurrent thoughts passing through one's mind, but also with respect to beliefs and desires understood as states that we may share with non-rational animals or young children, such as simply wanting a piece of fruit, simply (occurrently) believing that there's a tree in front of one, etc.

In closing, it is worth noting that Bilgrami is not alone in seeking alternatives to the causal-perceptual and inferential views of self-knowledge.  But while it is clear that Bilgrami's view is informed by such alternatives (especially as these have been articulated by, among others, Wittgenstein and other expressivists, Burge, Shoemaker, Wright, Taylor, and Peacocke), they are either all too briefly mentioned or ignored in the book.  Readers may be especially puzzled by the absence of any mention of Moran's 2001 Authority and Estrangement, whose focus and broad approach seem rather close to those of Bilgrami.  In his preface, Bilgrami states that he "deliberately tried to avoid too much commentary on others who have written on the subject … in order to avoid a certain clutter" (p. xvi).  However, it seems that, especially given the book's nonstandard 'integrative' strategy, it would have been useful for the reader to have more explicit guidance on how to locate Bilgrami's view on the contemporary map and why his view is to be preferred, as well as more discussion of familiar and novel examples throughout.  Indeed, the few times Bilgrami does undertake comparisons with others' views, as in the discussions of Davidson and of McDowell, the result is very helpful.

Given the ambitious scope of the book and the brevity of this review, I have inevitably not been able to canvass all the original insights and ideas to be found in Self-Knowledge and Resentment.  But I hope to have said enough to encourage readers studying self-knowledge, agency, and intentionality to delve further into this book's interesting and tantalizing discussions of these topics.