Self-Knowledge for Humans

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Quassim Cassam, Self-Knowledge for Humans, Oxford University Press, 2014, 238pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199657575.

Reviewed by Peter Carruthers, University of Maryland, College Park


This book appears to have two primary goals. One is to critique what Quassim Cassam calls "Rationalism" about self-knowledge. This is the view, associated especially with Richard Moran (2001), that the primary way one knows what one believes (or wants, or hopes) is by reflecting on what one ought rationally to believe (or want, or hope). Cassam shows, carefully and patiently (perhaps too carefully and patiently) that this view has little to be said for it, and much to be said against it. He points out, for example, that Rationalism often substitutes a hard question in place of an easy one. In many circumstances it is easy for people to know what they believe or want, where it would be quite hard for them to figure out what they rationally should believe or want. To the extent that this is true (as it frequently is, surely), it suggests that people are not in fact arriving at self-knowledge in the way that Rationalism postulates.

(In addition, notice that in order to know what you believe, on a Rationalist account, you would first need to know your occurrent judgments about what you should believe. Likewise on the sort of "transparency view" associated with Alex Byrne (2005), you would at least need to know your occurrent judgments about what is the case. So Rationalism and related views take for granted forms of knowledge of mental states that presumably cannot be cashed out in Rationalist terms. At this point such views will need to appeal to some other sort of account: perhaps a version of inner sense theory, or some sort of expressivism, or perhaps by maintaining that occurrent judgments can occur in an access-conscious manner. All are rejected in Carruthers, 2011, 2015.)

Moreover, Rationalism presupposes a conception of what humans are like that is wildly at odds with both scientific evidence and common-sense experience. Cassam refers to this conception as "homo philosophicus", bringing out its close similarities with the homo economicus of classical economics, which has been heavily criticized by Daniel Kahneman (2011), Gerd Gigerenzer (1999), and others who belong to the more recent tradition of experimental economics. Homo philosophicus, like homo economicus, is a supremely rational creature, whereas the beliefs and desires of real humans are caused through all sorts of complex causal routes, and are frequently at odds with what they should be.

The book's second main goal is to urge that philosophers should pay more attention to what Cassam calls "substantial self-knowledge", which includes knowledge of your own traits of character, your aptitudes, and your deepest values. This is the sort of self-knowledge that interests ordinary people, and Cassam thinks (partly for this reason) that it should be of interest to philosophers, too. But in fact almost all philosophical discussions of self-knowledge focus on cases that are thought to be trivial, such as your knowledge that you currently believes you are wearing socks.

As Cassam emphasizes, one reason philosophers have focused so heavily on trivial self-knowledge is that it is thought to be epistemologically distinctive and puzzling. No one thinks that substantial knowledge of oneself is especially easy to come by, and everyone allows that it is evidence-based, much like our substantial knowledge of the traits, aptitudes, and values of other people. But philosophers have traditionally believed that knowledge of our own beliefs, desires, hopes, judgments, intentions, and other current propositional attitudes is special, and quite different from the evidence-based knowledge that we have of the mental states of other people. While few would now join Descartes in thinking that our own propositional attitudes are both self-intimating and directly knowable with complete certainty, most continue to believe that self-knowledge of this sort is somehow especially direct and reliable, and is not based on evidence. Cassam argues convincingly that this consensus view is mistaken, however (drawing partly from some of my own arguments in Carruthers, 2011). On the contrary, knowledge of our own propositional attitudes is evidence-based, just as is substantial self-knowledge. Now, one might be tempted to construe this conclusion as being itself an argument for the view that philosophers are wrong to focus exclusively on trivial self-knowledge. For if the conclusion is true, then it turns out that all self-knowledge is evidence-based, and hence that there is no principled distinction between the two kinds. Since an evidential account of trivial self-knowledge will surely be highly contested, however, it would be premature for philosophers to turn away from debating the trivial cases just yet.

Moreover, there are also other legitimate reasons why philosophers are seemingly so obsessed with trivial forms of self-knowledge. One is because of the puzzling questions such self-knowledge raises for issues to do with cognitive architecture and the nature of human rationality. Some have concluded that our attitudes are made available to us via distinctive mechanisms designed for the purpose (an "inner sense"). Others have believed that our conscious attitudes are available for self-attribution by virtue of being access-conscious, perhaps occupying a sort of "global workspace" that makes them (while figuring in the workspace) both self-intimating and immediately knowable. Yet others have tried to show, in contrast, that trivial self-knowledge can be accounted for without needing to make any such commitments (as do Moran and Byrne). And many have claimed that it is a requirement of human rational agency that knowledge of our own attitudes should be constitutively bound up with the nature and possession of those attitudes themselves (Shoemaker, 1994; Burge, 1996; note that the commitment to human rationality, here, need not involve anything as strong as homo philosophicus). So the topic is of philosophical importance not just for epistemology, but also for the philosophy of mind, and for issues to do with the architecture of the mind. Indeed, if evidence-based views of the sort Cassam defends are correct (as they are), then philosophers may need to rethink what it means to be a rational agent. In fact, if it is a requirement for beliefs to qualify as conscious that they should be knowable by their subjects in a way that isn't evidence-based, as many think, then it will turn out that there are no such things as conscious beliefs. (For defense of just such a view, see Carruthers, 2011, 2015.)

None of this implies that philosophers should not also devote attention to substantial self-knowledge, of course. And Cassam is surely right that they should. In part this is because of the practical importance of such knowledge, but also because such knowledge might give rise to philosophical questions of its own. I believe that Cassam understands substantial self-knowledge far too narrowly, however. In particular, he conceives of it as knowledge of one's own individually-knowable characteristics, rather than knowledge of oneself qua human being, or qua human being of some well-defined sub-category (adult male, for example, or introvert). Likewise, for all his emphasis on findings from psychology and experimental economics in making the case against homo philosophicus, when it comes to the basis for substantial self-knowledge Cassam's discussion is concerned exclusively with individually-available facts such as one's past behavior and a variety of kinds of mental promptings (visual imagery, inner speech, and the like).

This seems to me a large omission, and an opportunity lost. For many of the most important forms of self-knowledge, I suggest, derive from generalizations about human cognition and motivation discovered by psychologists and other cognitive scientists. Indeed, even the famous injunction "Know thyself", which was inscribed on the walls of the temple of Apollo at Delphi, and which is cited by Cassam as indicating the kind of substantial self-knowledge he is interested in, was probably intended to remind worshipers of their mortal status, or -- as it is used in Alexander Pope's famous poem that begins, "Know, then, thyself" -- to encourage people to understand their human nature. Substantial self-knowledge is arguably just as much about knowing one's own humanity (or sub-category of humanity) as it is about knowing one's own individual characteristics. Moreover, it is this form of science-based self-knowledge that gives rise to some of the deepest philosophical questions.

Consider, for example, the unexpected discovery of the influence exerted by implicit biases for or against different social groups, as well as people's surprising reliance on implicit stereotypes about those groups (Banaji and Greenwald, 2013). (These are often conflated in philosophical discussions, but should be treated separately. Biases are evaluative dispositions directed towards members of a group, whereas stereotypes are generalizations about a group, probably stored in the form of generics like "Men are leaders" or "Women are caring." While they often overlap, they can vary independently of one another. See Amodio and Devine, 2006.) These findings give rise to a whole host of challenging philosophical questions. For example, are you morally obliged to get yourself tested to learn of your implicit attitudes? And to what extent can people be held responsible for the pernicious effects of implicit attitudes they don't know they possess, many of which are acquired quite early in childhood? Whatever it is that ordinary folk have in mind when they think of self-knowledge, it is issues of this sort that philosophers should mostly be concerned with, it seems to me.

There are numerous other examples of substantial generality-based self-knowledge that is well worth having and that does, or should, give rise to philosophical scrutiny. (Indeed, I regularly teach a course at my institution called Know Thyself: Wisdom Through Cognitive Science that is built around many of these topics.) For instance, there is now an extensive literature on the ways in which people rely on affective responses when making decisions, and of the role of incidental affect in influencing those decisions (Gilbert and Wilson, 2005). This gives rise to a new problem of substantial self-knowledge: how do I know to what extent I really want something? How do I separate the affect that arises in response to the thing itself from the affect created by the weather, by the context, and by my mood? We know that attempting to take decisions purely discursively, without relying on "gut feelings", can often lead to worse outcomes (e.g., Wilson et al., 1993). Yet it isn't obvious how one should (or whether it is even possible to) parse one's gut feelings in components linked to their respective causes.

Despite these omissions, Self-Knowledge for Humans is a truly fine book. It is clearly and elegantly written, and metes out criticism fairly while developing a number of lines of powerful argument. It demonstrates where most philosophical discussions of self-knowledge have gone astray, puts forward a plausible positive theory of insubstantial self-knowledge, and makes an important start on the project of examining the nature and importance of substantial self-knowledge. It deserves to be widely read.


Amodio, D. and Devine, P. (2006). Stereotyping and evaluation in implicit race bias: Evidence for independent constructs and unique effects on behavior. Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 91, 652-661.

Banaji, M. and Greenwald, A. (2013). Blindspot: Hidden Biases of Good People. Random House.

Burge, T. (1996). Our entitlement to self-knowledge. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 96, 91-116.

Byrne, A. (2005). Introspection. Philosophical Topics, 33, 79-104.

Carruthers, P. (2011). The Opacity of Mind: An Integrative Theory of Self-Knowledge. Oxford University Press.

Carruthers, P. (2015). The Centered Mind: What the Science of Working Memory Shows Us About the Nature of Human Thought. Oxford University Press.

Gigerenzer, G., Todd, P., and the ABC Research Group. (1999). Simple Heuristics that Make Us Smart. Oxford University Press.

Kahneman, D. (2011). Thinking, Fast and Slow. Allen Lane.

Moran, R. (2001). Authority and Estrangement. Princeton University Press.

Shoemaker, S. (1994). Self-knowledge and "inner sense"; Lecture II. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 54, 271-290.

Wilson, T. and Gilbert, D. (2005). Affective forecasting: Knowing what to want. Current Directions in Psychological Science, 14, 131-134.

Wilson, T., Lisle, D., Schooler, J., Hodges, S., Klaaren, K., and LaFleur, S. (1993). Introspecting about reasons can reduce post-choice satisfaction. Personality and Social Psychology Bulletin, 19, 331-339.