Self, No-Self? Perspectives from Analytical, Phenomenological, and Indian Traditions

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Mark Siderits, Evan Thompson, and Dan Zahavi (eds.), Self, No-Self? Perspectives from Analytical, Phenomenological, and Indian Traditions, Oxford University Press, 2011, 337pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199593804.

Reviewed by Robert J. Howell, Southern Methodist University


Self, No-Self? is a welcome product of a rare endeavor: the attempt to bring insights from diverse schools of thought to bear on a question of deep philosophical interest. The question, as the title suggests, is whether or not there is a self. It's fairly common knowledge that this has been addressed by Western philosophers as diverse as Hume, Kant, Sartre, Wittgenstein, and Dennett. Most schooled in parts of that tradition also have a passing sense that the topic is central to various schools of Buddhism and perhaps some other ancient doctrines of the East. But few have paid those schools more than lip-service. The editors of this volume, and the contributors to it, do us a significant service by beginning to remedy this neglect. Drawing upon considerations from various schools of Buddhism, Indian Philosophy, phenomenology, analytic philosophy, and cognitive science, the papers in Self, No-Self? cannot fail to advance both the reader's understanding of the issues at play and her grasp of the history of the non-Western approaches to those issues.

Although the self is the main focus of this collection, students of the nature and structure of consciousness will find much food for thought. There is a great deal of discussion, for example, of the "reflexivity thesis" that all consciousness is consciousness of itself. Too often this thesis is presented as an uncontroversial datum, but in this collection arguments are given for and against it, most explicitly in the papers by Evan Thompson (for) and Mark Siderits (against). In addition, there is related work on issues of time consciousness, drawing from work by Husserl, Dainton, and others, and an illuminating discussion of self-knowledge by Galen Strawson. These issues are not asides. It is a virtue of this collection that it draws attention to the connection between the study of the self and subjectivity and the issues of the nature of consciousness.

Hunters of the self often differ in the definition of their quarry. For this reason it's often difficult to get a grasp on what is at issue in debates about the existence of the self. Are we asking whether there is a soul, or some substantival ego? Are we asking whether there is a subject of experiences? Whether there are persons? Are we asking whether "I" refers, or whether "I"-statements are true? Complications multiply because philosophers also differ about what is required for something to exist. If x is reducible to y, does x exist? Must x be a "fundamental" constituent of reality? Relatedly, some denials of the self are motivated by the sense that there is something particularly elusive or illusory about the self, but others are motivated by a general commitment to a sort of metaphysical reductionism or mereological nihilism. This generates different sorts of theses. Some forms of Buddhism, for example, think that there is no self, but they also think there are no tables because everything is ultimately a manifestation of underlying flux. Denying a self for these reasons is quite different than denying it for the reasons of Sartre or Dennett.

These issues trouble the debate about the self, and the problem becomes particularly pronounced in a collection of articles such as this one. While the editors' introduction provides some help, there is sometimes the sense that the authors -- or the schools they represent -- are speaking past one another and that many issues are terminological. Even those who claim to be denying the existence of a self -- Miri Albahari, Joel Krueger, and Georges Dreyfus, for example -- agree that there is a "witness consciousness" or some other form of "minimal self." It becomes difficult to see, sometimes, how this differs from the view of Dan Zahavi or Galen Strawson who believe there is a self, though not necessarily an enduring substance outside of the stream of consciousness. All the authors, excepting perhaps Siderits, seem to admit that there is something corresponding to "I" even if it is little more than self-aware conscious states. One could be forgiven for wondering what is at stake. In fact, I think, the Buddhists have an answer that is articulated by Albahari, Wolfgang Fasching, and others: the noxious notion of self is not the thin, witness-consciousness, but the sense of self that arises from a process of appropriating objects, states, and situations as "mine." There is also the related issue, emphasized in the article by Thompson, of whether or not the self endures or whether it is simply a locus of the synchronic unity of consciousness. So despite the initial sense of confusion, the diverse approaches of the authors can bear fruit for the careful reader by helping him disentangle some of the issues that tend to get lumped together under the general question of "self."

The inclusion of diverse traditions should be praised, but it does not come without expense. Phenomenology, analytic philosophy, Buddhism, and Indian philosophy all have their various jargons and when they come together in a paragraph one can begin to choke on the soup. (If you find phenomenological terminology obscure, there is nothing like a little Sanskrit to leaven the mix.) One also suspects that some of these bedfellows are too strange to be in the same inn. Damasio, Dennett, and Metzinger certainly seem to be saying things that resonate with the doctrines of, say, Advaita Vedānta, but I'm not sure that their concepts of consciousness (or streams of consciousness) are similar enough for the comparison to be more than superficial. Finally, as a Westerner rather ignorant of other traditions, I must admit that keeping track of all the different schools of thought (Yogācāra, Abhidharma, Mādhyamika, etc.) as well as all the teachers of those schools (Śaṅkara, Vasubandhu, etc.) was difficult. It's ultimately worth it, since the other side of this neophyte's lament is that I have a new drive to familiarize myself with these canons. But it does make for a more challenging read.

The arguments of the eleven articles in Self, No-Self? are so numerous that it would be a challenge to attempt a succinct summary, though there does seem to be a common thread that is worth questioning. Even when authors are defending the existence of a self, as do Strawson and Zahavi, there seems to be a sort of anti-realism about the self such that it is not the sort of thing that can extend beyond first-personal consciousness of it. While it does seem plausible that a creature must be capable of a first-person perspective to be said to have a self, and it further seems that such a perspective is bound up with some form of phenomenal consciousness, this conception of the self doesn't preclude its being something that extends beyond this perspective. If such a realism can't be blocked, the acknowledgment of a minimal self is a dangerous first step to the recognition of the noxious, more full-blooded sort of self Buddhism wishes to dismiss. In other words, if the authors defending no-self views are comfortable with admitting something like a minimal self, they must block a realism about the self which holds that the "minimal self" is just the minimal grasp of the self which nonetheless extends beyond the first-person perspective on it. Of course, this possibility will not daunt the no-self theorist who also doesn't believe in brains; the pillar of their argument will now be their mereological nihilism which goes largely undefended.

Although there is much to quibble with here and there in the various pieces comprising Self, No-Self?, few philosophers interested in the self and consciousness will walk away empty-handed. It's a welcome addition to the recent books bringing the issue of the self back to the fore of philosophy of mind, and it offers an appealing entry into some of the schools of Eastern philosophy that too often go overlooked in the West.