Self, Reason, and Freedom: A New Light on Descartes' Metaphysics

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Andrea Christofidou, Self, Reason, and Freedom: A New Light on Descartes' Metaphysics, Routledge, 2013, 269pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415501064.

Reviewed by C. P. Ragland, Saint Louis University


For a long time, Anglophone commentators on Descartes' Meditations gave the Fourth Meditation short shrift, but in the last fifteen years or so, it has increasingly piqued their interest. Exemplifying that trend, Christofidou studies the entire Meditations in light of concepts central to the Fourth. She presents Descartes' method of doubt as a "self-administered" form of "Socratic . . . elenchus" (8) in which the meditator seeks truth by rejecting all authorities but that of Reason. Because employing the method is a free exercise of active will, freedom is at the heart of Descartes' project.

As someone who has thought long and hard about Descartes' conception of freedom, I found Christofidou's central contention both accurate and exciting. I also agree completely with her characterization of Descartes as fundamentally a seeker after metaphysical and physical truth -- understood as correspondence of thought with reality -- rather than as an epistemologist or a proto-idealist. Nevertheless, the book frustrated me, probably because of the way it is "pitched". It is clearly written for scholars, often presuming a good deal of background knowledge both of the secondary literature on Descartes and of the broader history of modern philosophy (especially Kant). But it is organized like a gloss on the entire Meditations, such as might be helpful to beginning students of Descartes, and so covers a lot of material in a relatively small number of pages. As a result, though Christofidou articulates a provocative -- sometimes brilliant -- vision of Descartes' metaphysics and demonstrates a great deal of unity behind the many disparate arguments in the Meditations, she does not have space to give Descartes specialists like myself what they most want: careful exegetical reasons to prefer her controversial interpretive moves to their competitors. Non-specialists, on the other hand, are likely to find many parts of her presentation hard to follow.

I will briefly summarize highlights of each chapter and then lay out what I consider to be the book's most significant strengths and weaknesses.

In chapter one, Christofidou suggests that Descartes uses skeptical arguments to undermine three principles of knowledge: the dream argument calls into question the "principle of empiricism" (the idea that all our knowledge comes either from or through the senses), the deceiving God argument questions both the "principle of rationalism" (that knowledge of mathematical truths is perfectly stable and requires no metaphysical foundation) and the "principle of theology" (that knowledge can be obtained from authority). She proposes some very interesting connections between the evil genius scenario and the possibility (which Meditation One briefly considers and then rejects) of one's own madness.

Chapters two and three deal with Meditation Two. Chapter two explicates Descartes' first certainty: "I am, I exist," which (according to Chrstofidou) he grasps -- not through inference but intuition (44-48) -- as he actively wills to resist the wiles of the evil genius. She then defends Descartes against some of Kant's criticisms of the first certainty.

Chapter three concerns the nature of the I revealed in the first certainty. Contrary to Kant's charge, Descartes does not derive, "on the basis of the first certainty . . . substantial metaphysical claims about the self" (72) such as that it is essentially thinking and simple. Kant was also wrong, Christofidou suggests, when he thought that it is impossible to derive any knowledge aboutwhat I am (as opposed to how I appear to myself) from the certainty that I am (62). For in Descartes' "essentialist" perspective "neither knowledge of the existence nor knowledge of what something is can be demonstrated without the other" (63). Descartes can legitimately conclude in Meditation Two that he is a "thinking and acting being" possessing both unity and numerical identity (62), even though he cannot yet conclude that he is essentially thinking and not extended. Despite their differences on self-knowledge, Descartes and Kant give freedom a similar role: just as Kant "affirms the knowability of the self from the moral standpoint . . . through the exercise of freedom" (68), so Descartes takes "the epistemic responsibility one manifests in freeing oneself from prejudices" (67) to yield some degree of self-knowledge.

Chapter four begins to cover the Third Meditation by explicating Descartes' views of ideas, reality and causation. According to Christofidou, Descartes is a "direct realist" for whom "representing is a matter of . . . thinking about . . . the object itself" (78). He does not accept the "veil of ideas" picture, according to which we are directly aware only of ideas; rather, he thinks that to have an idea of X just is to be directly aware of X. Truth is conformity of an idea with reality, which is "neither dependent on, nor invented by us" (79). Descartes can speak of reality coming in degrees because for him it involves "the two notion[s] of power and independence" (91). The Third Meditation's causal principles ("something cannot come from nothing," "an idea's cause must have at least as much formal reality as the idea has objective reality") build on the notion of explanatory independence. In discussing these causal principles, Christofidou helpfully emphasizes that Descartes accepted not only efficient causation, but also formal causation.

Many readers take the Third Meditation to offer two different arguments for God's existence, the first insisting that only God could cause Descartes' idea of God, and the second that only God could preserve Descartes himself in existence. In chapter five, Christofidou argues that this so-called second argument is in fact (as Descartes himself claimed in the First Replies) merely an explanation and clarification of the first argument. Her interpretation is compelling and well developed, especially her assertion that Descartes employs the notion of formal causality when claiming that God is self-caused (causa sui).

Chapter six argues for the Fourth Meditation's cogency and centrality to Descartes' project. Christofidou presents Descartes' problem of error and then shows how Descartes systematically surveyed possible responses to it: the source of error could be God, nothingness, or ourselves. After eliminating the first two options, Descartes shows that we err not because of any defect in our faculties, but because we misuse our freedom to pass judgment on matters that we do not clearly understand.

Chapter seven delves into Descartes' conception of freedom, relating it to his views of truth and goodness. Commentators have often wondered whether Descartes even has any consistent view of freedom, for he sometimes suggests that

(A) freedom always requires the ability to do otherwise,

but also characterizes assent to clear and distinct perceptions as

(B) a free act of will in which we cannot but engage.

Christofidou promises a "solution to this long-standing quandary" which shows that "Descartes' conception of freedom is consistent throughout his corpus" (142). Her solution draws on Descartes' distinction between two different "degrees" of freedom: "low-grade" indifference and "high grade" spontaneity. According to Christofidou, only indifference requires the ability to do otherwise; spontaneity (as exemplified in (B)) does not. She concludes that Descartes rejects (A), and that the passages that seem to endorse it do not really do so.

Chapter eight, covering the Fifth Meditation, deals with three main themes. First, in discussing the metaphysics of corporeality, Christofidou argues that for Descartes a particular corporeal body, such as a stone, is not strictly speaking a substance but rather "a mode of the one corporeal substance" (169). Next she explains Descartes' ontological argument for God's existence and various objections to it, including Kant's famous objection that existence is not a perfection. Finally, she addresses the problem of the Cartesian Circle: if we cannot be certain of anything before we know that God exists, then how can we prove God's existence? She answers that there are two types of knowledge: "time-bound" cognitio and "tenseless" scientia, and God is required only for the latter. We can use our cognitio to prove God's existence, whence flows scientia.

Chapter nine discusses two main topics: the Sixth Meditation argument that the corporeal world exists and Descartes' metaphysics of substance, attribute, and mode. Beginning from the Second Meditation's account of wax, Christofidou discusses Descartes' notion of body, his distinction between imagination and understanding, and the way these two play out in his proof of bodies and his response to the dream argument. Then, in a fascinating and careful discussion, she puzzles over the relation between Descartes' two different characterizations of substance -- as "an independent entity" and as "a subject of attributes" (200) -- finding them to be ultimately harmonious.

Chapter ten deals with the distinction between mind and body, as well as their union in the human person (Christofidou deliberately puts off discussion of both mind-body causal interaction and Descartes' response to the apparent divine deception involved in cases of dropsy). Christofidou claims that the so-called "real distinction" argument in the Sixth Medtitation is Descartes'only argument for dualism (most commentators would also include the "divisibility argument" and the earlier, problematic argument in the Discourse). She then presents the most important objections to the real distinction argument and considers Descartes' best responses to them.

* * * * * * * * *

Christofidou's interpretations are often subtle and complex, sometimes weaving together apparently incompatible strands. For example, in discussing the First Meditation she suggests that Descartes calls the reliability of Reason itself into doubt not with the deceiving-God argument, but rather with the evil demon hypothesis (33). This seems to conflict with her (accurate) characterization of the evil demon hypothesis as "not another skeptical argument" (32), but instead a psychological device to help the will "combat any tendency to fall back into old habits" (33).

At other times, Christofidou gets around apparent conflicts between her interpretation and Descartes' text by simply declaring that the text does not mean what it says. For example, she declares that Descartes' truth-rule ("everything I clearly and distinctly perceive is true") does not depend on theological considerations at all, but follows straightforwardly from Descartes' conceptions of representation and clarity and distinctness, according to which clear and distinct ideas are "an openness to reality, not a veil that shrouds reality" (89). So for Christofidou, the truth rule is established early in the Third Meditation (when Descartes notices that he could be certain of his own existence only because it was clear and distinct). But in the synopsis of theMeditations, Descartes himself said that "it is proved that everything that we clearly and distinctly perceive is true" in the Fourth Meditation (AT 7:15).[1] Christofidou's response: "It is not the principle [i.e. the truth-rule] that is proved. Rather, what is proved is that . . . everything we clearly and distinctly perceive has the marks of stability and lastingness" (83; my emphasis). Though I agree with the drift of her suggestion (we can have cognitio of many claims prior to knowing God), her gloss (italicized) flatly contradicts the sentence she is claiming to interpret. Why not say instead (as do many commentators these days) that God is needed for cognitio of the truth rule, which then raises all our knowledge to scientia?

In a few cases, Christofidou makes claims that are just plain wrong. She says "Descartes has not assumed that having a will means having freedom of the will" (149), but Descartes repeatedly implies that freedom is essential to the will, as when he declares "I call free in the general sense whatever is voluntary" (To Mesland, 2 May 1644; AT 4:116). She also says that "degrees of freedom are not quantitative" (150) but qualitative; however, in his 1645 letter to Mesland, Descartes repeatedly describes degrees of freedom in terms of amounts (for example: "I moved towards something all the more freely when there were more reasons driving me towards it" (AT 4:174)).

Here is my biggest complaint: for a book that puts freedom at the heart of Cartesian metaphysics, it is neither exegetically nor philosophically careful enough with Descartes' conception of freedom. For example, in chapter six Christofidou wonders: if freedom enables us to go wrong, why did God give it to us? Her answer: "the price (and Descartes would say, worth paying) for being rational and autonomous albeit finite beings is that we are liable to error" (139). This completely ignores Descartes' claim (in the Fourth Meditation) that "God could easily have brought it about that without losing my freedom, and despite the limitation in knowledge, I should nonetheless never make a mistake," in which case I would be "immune from error" (AT 7:61).

In chapter seven, Christofidou makes much of the distinction between spontaneity (high grade freedom) and indifference (low grade freedom), but her characterization of indifference seems skewed. She says that an indifferent will "can be influenced, even dominated by external forces" (151) like "habit and custom, passions and unexamined opinions", which "can determine the will to affirm or deny" (152). She says that "only when the will is at one with reason's clear and distinct perceptions," i.e. only when it is spontaneous, can it "properly be referred to as the rational self-determining will" (161). These remarks suggest that indifference is a kind of bondage to external forces and raise the question: how is indifference a kind of freedom? Though Christofidou does not address this question, the answer is not far to seek. For Descartes, the "indifferent" will is still self-determining, never determined to err, so we can always do the rational thing in unclear situations: we can suspend judgment. Through the correct use of indifference, we can avoid error and thwart even an omnipotent deceiver.

Along with these flaws, the book contains flashes of brilliance and penetrating insight. For example, the end of chapter one offers the best discussion I have ever seen of the most radical of Descartes' worries, the thought that "if we accept the use of reason" it may lead us "to absurdity on its own terms" (34). Christofidou's discussion of the relation between substance and attribute in chapter nine is subtle, perceptive, and compelling. And her observation that Descartes is an essentialist -- someone who thinks that we cannot know whether something is unless we also know what it is -- bears repeated fruit, returning again and again to demonstrate a deep unity behind what initially appear to be quite disparate Cartesian positions. Descartes scholars cannot afford to ignore this book, and it offers interested non-specialists a new way to appreciate the depth and power of Descartes' insights.[2]

[1] "AT" is an abbreviation for Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, eds., Oeuvres de Descartes, 2nd ed., 11 vols. (Paris: Vrin/C.N.R.S., 1974-86); it is followed by volume number: page number.

[2] Thanks to Everett Fulmer and Tom Lennon for their comments on an earlier draft of this review.