Self to Self: Selected Essays

Placeholder book cover

J. David Velleman, Self to Self: Selected Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 385pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521670241.

Reviewed by Sergio Tenenbaum, University of Toronto


Self to Self collects eleven articles David Velleman has published in the last decade, as well as two previously unpublished articles ("The Centered Self" and "A Brief Introduction to Kantian Ethics"), and a useful and substantive introduction.  This is an outstanding group of articles: each one is truly excellent, and a number of them rank among the best recent philosophical papers on moral psychology, ethics and agency.  The volume exhibits a thematic unity much greater than one would expect from such a collection.  Three large themes are interwoven through the book: (1) a defense of a broadly Kantian ethics and moral psychology infused with certain Freudian elements; (2) a defense of a theory of action in which the motive of making sense of one's actions is constitutive of agency; (3) a defense of a view about the self that stems from Velleman's claim that the word "self" "is just a word used to express reflexivity" (354), such that different contexts of the use of the word "self" will pick out different kinds of reflexivity. The third theme provides the main guiding thread of the book; according to Velleman, the self is not a single entity that gets picked out consistently in discussions from personal identity to debates about identification in the philosophy of action.  Instead, 'self' "expresses a reflective guise under which parts or aspects of a person are present to his own mind" (1).  Rather than a single self, there are various "reflexive guises under which a person tends to regard aspects of himself" (7). In particular, Velleman identifies the following guises: (i) my self-concept or my self image, the guise under which I represent the kind of person I take myself to be, the kind of picture of myself that I would reveal if, for instance, I were to honestly answer the request "tell me about yourself" on a first date; (ii) the guise of personal identity, or the persons I represent as being my past and future selves; (iii) the guise of autonomous agency, the guise under which I represent some, but not all, of my bodily movements to be actions of mine.

"A Brief Introduction to Kantian Ethics" provides a useful outline of the main tenets of Velleman's Kantianism.  As a consequence of being an outline of a sweeping view, some of the central arguments seem sketchy at points.  For instance, in this relatively short piece, Velleman argues that we must think ourselves as autonomous (35), that autonomy "consists in being determined by authoritative considerations" (35), and that "our aspiration toward autonomy yields a requirement to act for reasons" (36), which in turn will "forbid us to act on considerations whose practical implication couldn't be common knowledge" (36).  This all moves very fast, but it gives a very useful overview of how Velleman understands the central arguments for a Kantian ethics.

In the "Voice of Conscience", Velleman tries to reconstruct the derivation of the Categorical Imperative as an attempt to derive the content of conscience from the nature of its authority.  The kind of authority that conscience, and the moral law, has stems from its claim to be common knowledge among all rational thinkers; it claims to be what all rational thinkers would think, and would think that rational thinkers think, etc.  The universalization procedure is then understood as a procedure that checks whether a first-personal practical thought (such as "I shall lie") can be taken to be what all rational thinkers would think (and would think that all rational thinkers would think, etc.) in similar circumstances.  Since no universalization procedure will succeed without assuming common knowledge that the maxim is a universal law, this interpretation has the advantage of making common knowledge essential to the nature of the procedure rather than an ad hoc assumption.

"Rational Superego" proposes a marriage of Kant and Freud, in which Velleman understands the Categorical Imperative as something along the lines of an ego ideal, the part of the superego that represents "the excellences of parental figures" (112).  Freudian theory can supply Kantian ethics with a model of moral development through our loving relationship to others.  On the other hand, Freud's theory can gain in plausibility if it incorporates a more rationalist view of the superego, a view in which the child internalizes not just a parental figure of arbitrary authority, but an ideal of a loving parent whose "self-gratification is subordinated to rational requirements embodied in another person" (154).  Most of the paper focuses on how Freudian theory has much to gain from this match, and I think that Velleman makes a good case for this conclusion.  However, I cannot avoid feeling that the Sage of Konigsberg is marrying down.  What could a plausible normative theory gain by shacking up with poorly confirmed psychological speculation (or in less tendentious terms, a controversial psychological theory)?  Velleman suggests that the idea of internalizing something else provides a familiar model for moral authority, but it is unclear why this is more familiar than internalizing the ideal of acting exactly as I ought to act, or the ideal of acting on the better reasons.  Velleman also claims that Freudian theory explains "what awakens us to the personhood of others" (132).  But why would Kant need to worry about how one gets up from a solipsistic slumber?  For Kant it is a moral requirement that we recognize other human beings as persons, as ends in themselves.  Unless a certain kind of psychological theory (remarkably) claims that this recognition is impossible, a Kantian need not show preference for any particular developmental theory.

In "Willing the Law", Velleman argues for accepting the Kantian view that "wrongdoing entails irrationality in the agent", while rejecting the Kantian tenet that "wrongdoing entails irrationality in the action" (285).  That is, according to Velleman's "concessive Kantianism" some agents' irrationality might consist in having reasons for actions that a rational agent ought not to have.  Velleman wants to replace orthodox Kantianism with this more concessive form.  I must first note that what Velleman calls "orthodox Kantianism" should certainly be rejected, but I can't see how Kant gets pinned down as an orthodox Kantian.  Velleman complains that according to Kant, the justifying force of a practical reason is a matter for the agent to decide, and this understanding of practical reason, Velleman correctly points out, cannot explain how an agent is guided by his reasons.  But this reading of Kant depends on taking the universalization procedure to be a constraint on reason's authorship of principle, rather than being what's constitutive of it.  One could describe Kant's view in the language of reasons for actions roughly as follows: in having certain inclinations, we find ourselves regarding various things as reasons for actions.  Conforming to the categorical imperative is necessary and sufficient for these purported reasons to be valid (and our autonomy consists in our capacity to be guided only by such reasons).  This way of reading Kant leaves us with no paradox of being guided by reasons we simply decide are valid.  Velleman considers something like this in his admirable reconstruction of Korsgaard's arguments.  However, Velleman focuses on a further feature of Korsgaard's position; namely, the claim that even impulses the satisfaction of which is incompatible with the categorical imperative can be the source of genuine reasons for the agent if the agent is committed to a practical identity.  Velleman persuasively argues that once one makes this move, one cannot stop short of concessive Kantianism, for it is now possible that one will configure one's space of reasons for action in such a way that wrongdoing is a rational option.  But one must note that this feature of Korsgaard's position is extraneous to Kant's view.  After all, Kant never argues that reflective endorsement per se, rather than conforming one's will to the categorical imperative, can make something into a genuine reason for action.  Velleman does note that Korsgaard here is departing from Kant, but he thinks that Kant finds himself in an even worse situation.  Velleman finds Kant committed to the view that the agent "can rewrite the set of available reasons [on every choice], and so almost anything goes" (307).  But this reading presupposes that Kant held an "existentialist" view of our non-moral ends; that is, that within the constraints of morality, an agent can simply decide ex nihilo what his ends will be.  This reading has considerably less textual support than the much (and rightly) criticized reading that Kant held a hedonist view of all non-moral ends or motives.

Of course, there is a sense in which we can choose to act on any maxim as long as it conforms to the categorical imperative; but this is the "can" of morality, not of real possibility.  Although (in most contexts) morality does not forbid or require howling at the moon, we have no inclination to do so, and thus no incentive to act in this manner.  We neither have any reason to howl at the moon nor can we create one by an act of the will.  The idea that Kant must accept that we can create reasons this way is a result of forcing on him an understanding of autonomy as liberty of indifference (what makes my actions free is that nothing other than CI constrains my choice).  But this is not Kant's understanding of freedom; we're fully free when we're fully determined by our rational capacities.  This picture certainly doesn't imply "an agent reinventing himself in every choice" (307) and can preserve the idea that every immoral action is irrational.

In the "Genesis of Shame", Velleman presents a compelling analysis of shame as rooted in a concern for our privacy.  Velleman starts from an analysis of the myth of Adam and Eve and suggests that what the serpent reveals to them is knowledge of the possibility not to indulge in their sexual instincts, the possibility of disobeying their instincts.  With this knowledge comes the risk that their sexual organs will be insubordinate to their will and literally reveal a different disposition; the possibility of this revelation gives rise to the first possibility of shame.  The concern for privacy arises from our need to construct a social persona for social interaction; when, in the case of sexual instinct, our body disobeys us, we are exposed as being other than our social persona.  The account then extends to any aspect of our selves that is revealed despite our efforts keep it private (or at least to keep it in the background); shame is an emotion that reflects "our sense of being compromised in our self-presentation" (60).

In "Love as a Moral Emotion", Velleman makes a powerful case for a view that would seem quite unintuitive at first.  According to Velleman, love is an "attitude toward the beloved himself, but not toward any result all" (88); in particular it is not a desire to promote his wellbeing or to share certain experiences with him.  After all, I can love people without being on the constant lookout to promote their wellbeing, or even without being particularly keen on the idea of sharing much with them.  The end of love is the beloved himself, and in particular, to love someone as a person is to "respond to the value that he possesses by virtue of being a person, or … an instance of rational nature" (100).  According to Velleman, this account explains why we can say that we love someone for who he is (i.e., a person) rather than for any of his particular qualities, without committing ourselves to the view that the object of our love can always be replaced by anyone else, since, after all, we're all persons.  Given that the value in question is dignity not price, it "requires that we respond to each person alone, partly by refusing to compare them with others" (102).

There is a near-consensus among philosophers who discuss guilt that guilt is an emotion properly felt only when we do something immoral.  However, as Velleman points out, we seem to have instances in which guilt seems appropriate and yet no wrongdoing has been committed.  Survivor guilt is a notable example of this phenomenon.  In "Don't Worry, Feel Guilty" Velleman first provides an analysis that fits the consensus: guilt is anxiety over having warranted a withdrawal of trust.  However, Velleman claims that it is plausible to extend this analysis to include also "anxiety about having warranted resentment" (166), which would allow the "scope" of guilt to extend to cases in which one is an object of resentment without having done anything wrong.

In "Self to Self", Velleman defends the view that "'self' has two related but ultimately distinct strands of meaning" (192).  The first meaning connotes identity, a metaphysical relation that "holds between persons at a time if they are the same person" (192).  The second meaning connotes reflexivity: "a past self might be someone (…) whom I can think of reflexively, in the first person" (193).  According to Velleman, a memory experience always represents two subjects: the subject who is having the memory (the "actual subject"), and the subject who in the past experienced what the memory represents (the "notional subject").  An experiential memory picks a past self just by being a memory of her experience, just by being a vestige of the scene represented from her vantage point, without any need of additional representation of this past self.  In this way, in cases of experiential memory, the person represented by the actual subject can think of the notional subject in the first person.  But in order to be able to think of someone in the first person one need not be metaphysically identical to her; I could have vestiges of Golda Meir's experiences in my mind.  Velleman argues that what matters in survival is not the metaphysical continuation of a person, but that there will be someone in the future whom I can "prefigure first-personally" (195).

"From Self Psychology to Moral Philosophy" tries to show that empirical psychology confirms to some extent Velleman's view of agency, and in particular, his view that agency is to be explained by agents' having "a motive to do what makes sense to them" (226).  Velleman draws in particular from experiments that bring to light phenomena such as cognitive dissonance and self-attribution, in which it is plausible to suppose that some such motive is playing a role both in providing (and even fabricating) an interpretation of one's own actions that would make sense and in acting out an interpretation of one's motives suggested by the experimental setting.

"Self as the Narrator" starts from a suggestion from Dennett that the self is a very useful explanatory fiction, just as "the center of gravity" is a useful fiction.  Our brains spin tales about a certain character, the self, but to think that the self is also an entity that is the author of these tales would be to make the same mistake as concluding that the author of Moby Dick is Ishmael because the novel starts with the line "Call me Ishmael".  Dennett drives home the idea that there is no real author to these stories by imagining a dumb robot that can write a passable novel that starts with the sentence "I am Gilbert".  Velleman argues that if we add some sophistication to Gilbert, we will no longer be able to say that this is a dumb computer; instead we will have a genuine agent with a self controlling its own behaviour.  In particular, suppose the narrating subroutine can not only confabulate or report what happens to Gilbert, but also influence the robot's behaviour.  In this case, the narrating subroutine does take the function of a self-controller; it not only determines Gilbert's behaviour, but it acts for reasons.  After all, for Velleman this is what an autonomous agent is, an agent who acts out his conception of what makes sense for him to do.  At this point the narrator is a real, intelligent self, in control of Gilbert's actions.

"Motivation by Ideal" starts by defending something like the Freudian idea of a drive.  According to Velleman, Freud is correct in identifying sources of motivation that "have only a vague direction in themselves but can be invested in specific activities" (314).  These drives can be engaged when we are acting out a story for certain purposes.  Suppose I want to stay fit but I don't enjoy physical activity per se.  I can garner motivation by relying on my drive for aggression; I sign up for martial arts class and eagerly enact a story of combat.  Of course, a well-adjusted martial arts fighter will also be strongly motivated to avoid causing any actual injury to his adversaries, and this motivation will prevent him from causing any actual injury.  However sometimes one might get carried away by the story and act irrationally; pretend fights can end up in real (and intended) injury.  Velleman argues that being "carried away" in this manner is what being motivated by an ideal consists in; motivation by ideal is motivation by "the image of another person or a currently untrue image of oneself, that one can get carried away with enacting" (325).  Since being motivated by an ideal is being motivated by reasons that one does not (yet) have, it is in most cases a form of irrationality, even if this kind of irrationality "can be exploited for more permanent gains in rationality" (324).  The exception, however, is being motivated by a moral ideal.  According to Velleman, "to do the moral thing by emulating a moral person really is to be moral, since enacting a moral image of oneself is what being a moral person consists in".

"Identification and Identity" was originally published as a contribution to a Festschrift for Frankfurt.  Velleman contrasts there his view developed in "Self to Self" with Frankfurt's conception of autonomy and personal identity.  Frankfurt's latest view tries to understand autonomy and personal identity in terms of volitional necessity; that is, roughly, in terms of motives against which the agent is willingly incapable to act.  Velleman persuasively argues that Frankfurt's picture conflates a conception of the self and literal personal identity; revising one's self-conception might be difficult and even something that we might have strong pro tanto reasons to resist, but it certainly is nothing like literal death.

"The Centered Self" is a fascinating piece in which Velleman tries to show that his account of agency can explain a normative requirement to be "centered" or "grounded", and, more particularly, rational pressure to make and carry out credible commitments.  The body of the paper is mostly concerned with showing how Velleman's account of agency can generate (or at least move closer to) a solution to the Prisoner's Dilemma.  According to Velleman, treatments of the Prisoner's Dilemma have been derailed by the assumption that practical reasoning is purely instrumental.  However, Velleman argues that the "conception of practical reasoning as the shortcut to self-understanding does not presuppose that behaviour must be understood instrumentally".  In particular we can also "understand behaviour expressively", and on this view "a belief can provide either instrumental or expressive reasons for acting" (267); in either case one's own actions would be intelligible to oneself.  Expressive reasons are roughly reasons to "speak one's mind"; they arise from the possibility of making sense of a certain piece of behaviour as a case of expressing one's mental states.  Thus when in a prisoner's dilemma someone says "I'll cooperate if you will", she cannot understand her behaviour strategically since she knows that there'll be no purely instrumental reason to cooperate, and this absence of a reason to cooperate is common knowledge among rational agents in a prisoner's dilemma.  Thus an agent couldn't make sense of expressing an insincere (or sincere) intention for instrumental reasons, but she could make sense of expressing a sincere intention for expressive reasons.  Since this is common knowledge, I can make a credible, sincere offer to cooperate in a Prisoner's Dilemma situation.  Moreover the need to tell a coherent and integrated story about our actions will also give us a reason to carry out the intention when it comes time to cooperate.

Now there are at least two questions we should ask about this solution: is it available only (or even more readily) to someone who subscribes to Velleman's theory of agency, and, second, does it really help solve the Prisoner's Dilemma?[1]  I suspect the answer to both questions is "no".  Let us start with the first question.  Velleman is right that one can make sense of one's speech behaviour as an instance of expressing one's thoughts, and thus one can easily accommodate the existence of such reasons within Velleman's theory.  But would the existence of such reasons be any less plausible within any other theory of practical reason?  In fact, even a purely instrumental or maximizing conception of rationality can accommodate something like expressive reasons.  Velleman himself illustrates the force of these reasons by drawing our attention to how difficult it is for us to bite our tongue, and how natural it is to speak our mind.  This kind of behaviour could just as well be explained by a basic desire to express oneself, which would then ground such reasons in an instrumentalist framework.  Of course, adding such a desire within an instrumentalist framework does no more than change the payoff structure.  This can't work as a general solution to the Prisoner's Dilemma; we can build new Prisoner's Dilemma situations on the basis of the new payoffs.  But is Velleman's solution any better?  It's hard to evaluate Velleman's solution, since he never explains how instrumental and expressive reasons interact.[2]  But even in the absence of a detailed account of how instrumental reasons and expressive reasons combine, the very existence of expressive reasons seems to undermine Velleman's solution to the Prisoner's Dilemma.  For now the agent does have an instrumental reason to make an insincere offer to cooperate.  As long as the other agent knows that there are expressive reasons to express sincere offers, there's some chance he'll take my insincere offer to be a sincere one.  Velleman considers something like this possibility but he rejects it because he thinks it would start a very complex line of strategic reasoning, and this would disqualify the option of thinking instrumentally as a possible way of making sense of my actions.  But I can't see why this is true.  Given that the cost of making an utterance is very low, effectively any probability higher than zero that my expression will be taken as a sincere expression gives me an easy to grasp instrumental reason to make an insincere assertion.  And given the existence of expressive reasons, the probability can't be zero.  It's worth noting that Velleman himself argues that having a unified and integrated account of one's reasons for actions is a normative demand we place on ourselves.  So by his own scorekeeping the instrumentalist has an important advantage: he can at least explain how our expressive reasons are integrated with our other reasons.

The papers in Self to Self merit much more detailed engagement than I have been able to undertake here.  The volume collects some of the best papers written on the topics of self, moral psychology, and Kantian ethics in the last decade.  It almost goes without saying that Self to Self is required reading for anyone who has any interest in any of these topics.  But I hereby say it anyway.

[1] To be fair, Velleman himself does not think that this can be a completely general solution, and it obviously cannot solve Prisoner's Dilemma type situations in which agents are not in a position to exchange promises of cooperation.

[2] One obvious way to do it, encouraged by Velleman's citation of Nozick in this regard, is to give weights to the different kinds of reasons within a larger maximizing framework, but this is not a very plausible route.  If there were consistent weights for expressive reasons, they would be very close to zero.  Just think about what you would do if you were charged $0.10 in a neuroscience lab every time you expressed your mental states, and received $0.10 every time you expressed a falsehood about your mental states.