Self-Transformations: Foucault, Ethics, and Normalized Bodies

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Cressida J. Heyes, Self-Transformations: Foucault, Ethics, and Normalized Bodies, Oxford University Press, 2007, 162pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195310542.

Reviewed by Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


Deeply informed by both contemporary feminist theory and Michel Foucault's genealogical method and analytics of power, Cressida Heyes' Self-Transformations presents an extended consideration of a set of bodily practices that are increasingly common in North America, namely, sex reassignment surgeries and related sex-transformational regimes, dieting for the purpose of weight-loss, and cosmetic surgeries such as face-lift, liposuction, gastric bypass, and rhinoplasty. The book's discussion of these practices is interesting, nuanced, and politically sensitive. Heyes does an excellent job of reviewing the academic debates surrounding them and explicating the objections that many feminist social critics have made to them. But she doesn't stop there. She also critically, yet sympathetically, examines the claims and reports of those who take up these techniques and technologies and use them in their own projects of self-transformation. And she even goes so far as to take up one such practice herself, enrolling for a ten-month stint in Weight Watchers. Her descriptions in every case are vivid and compelling, and her prose is clear and honest, as well as often quietly amusing.

Despite the book's straightforward tone, concrete examples, and relatively simple style, however, its thesis and themes are importantly complex. Its central issue is not whether these various techniques for altering the human body are repressive or, on the contrary, self-expressive; the central issue is not whether feminists should endorse these practices or condemn them and have them outlawed. In this book, detached moral judgment is displaced, and a different kind of ethical discourse comes to the fore. Heyes is concerned about normalization and the foreclosure of freedom it portends, and she is clear and adamant that these practices are normalizing, sometimes in the extreme. But as a student of Foucault she rejects both a sovereign account of selfhood and the notion that power is external to selves and primarily prohibitive, and thus she resists the feminist temptation to see trans men and women, recidivist dieters, and candidates for cosmetic surgery as mere dupes or victims of the normalizing sexist ideologies and institutions that they at times recite and inhabit.

The book's first order of business is to address the assumptions that lead many feminists to succumb to these temptations. For this work Heyes turns, perhaps surprisingly, to the musings of Ludwig Wittgenstein. We are sometimes held captive by our "pictures of the world," she says, following Wittgenstein's suggestive analysis in Philosophical Investigations. Although we must approach the world through some kind of "picture" (18) -- that is, with some set of expectations and organizational or interpretive strategies -- when our pictures prevent us from imagining any alternatives for ourselves, we become imprisoned in a way of life; we become unfree (19). Two ubiquitous pictures are especially dangerous on Heyes' view. One is that of the self as a deep, discoverable nature hidden beneath our bodily surfaces and behaviors. The other is that of power as an external force that acts to prevent that true self from becoming audible and visible. These two dovetail, Heyes maintains, at the point of the body, the canvas or stage where the deep self may or may not be able to express its nature in the face of powerful social institutions and ideals. With both these pictures operative but implicit and uninterrogated in their thinking, feminists have been unable to see how normalizing power actually works or what alternatives there are to its hegemonic dictates. As a result, feminist analyses of bodily practices such as the ones Heyes considers have tended to be fruitless and even counter-productive, she contends. For example, feminists have assumed that the means by which individuals are enticed into diet plans and cosmetic surgeries are largely representational or symbolic; as a result, they have misjudged the allure such practices have for people who wish to develop self-control and a sense of autonomy, however limited, and thus have missed an opportunity to offer something better. Worse still, assuming that sex reassignment surgeries simply reinforce popular images of ideal femininity and masculinity, feminists have been unable to make common cause with trans people, people who arguably bear the brunt of gender normalization (39).

If we set those two pictures aside, Heyes argues -- and she thinks Foucault's genealogical work helps us to do that -- it becomes possible to see occurrences of freedom and possibilities for imaginative alternatives even within very rigid regimes of gender normalization. Normalizing power produces, as Foucault tells us; it produces capacities as well as timidity and obedience. Thus the subjects of normalizing disciplinary practices really are empowered at the same time that they are disempowered. They become subjects, and agents, within these practices, and the failures they may well lament are also moments of excess in relation to the norms and rules that feminist critics of those practices might find lamentable. The self caught up in networks of gender normalization is not, or at least not merely, a victim without hope of extrication. There is hope, Heyes maintains; in fact, one of her own ethical tenets is that feminists must not give in to intellectually-inflected despair (112). But that hope cannot be seized upon through a discourse of political or ethical condemnation.

Some of Heyes' most compelling arguments occur in chapter three ("Foucault Goes to Weight Watchers") where she investigates a practice that is surely familiar to every North American, namely, dieting to lose weight. There she makes clear -- in case there is some reader out there who might doubt it -- that commercial diet plans and the discourses surrounding them are profoundly normalizing. The standards or "norms" by which body weight is evaluated -- categories like "over-weight" and "obese" and ratio charts like the Body Mass Index -- are more or less arbitrary; they were established by actuarial insurance companies without any grounding in comprehensive statistical studies and have changed over time in relation to current fashion rather than medical research. They have no clear correlation with mortality or morbidity; thus the common assumption that "ideal" weight is an indication of good health is simply false (68). The images of women put forth by the purveyors of diet plans and by the media industries that depend on their advertising dollars are strictly gendered and, if instantiated, would tend to render women incapable of heavy manual labor or effective self-defense. What these industries produce is not weight loss, let alone health; what they produce is self-loathing that makes women (and in many cases men too) willing and even eager to spend large sums of money and devote substantial amounts of time and energy in pursuit of a goal that is at best elusive. They captivate people, bring them suffering, and impoverish them in a sad but all too familiar spectrum of ways. Yet, Heyes insists, that is not the full story.

Dieting, she reminds us, is a process, a practice; this is a characteristic of the phenomenon that she believes feminists such as Susan Bordo and Sandra Bartky have overlooked to the detriment of feminist theory and politics. Even if it fails to produce the espoused outcome -- weight loss -- dieting as a practice can be self-transformative. And Weight Watchers and other commercial diet plans emphasize this aspect of what they sell, precisely because their creators know -- and they know that their customers know -- that weight loss is unlikely to be a permanent result of their product. The rewards and the pleasures may often lie elsewhere, but they do exist. Heyes confesses,

It was not until I had spent quite some time at Weight Watchers, immersed in a diet culture from which my feminist politics had until then kept me far away, that I began to understand the satisfaction many women found not only in losing weight, but in working on themselves -- in however circumscribed a context.  (78)

Many found the practice of dieting empowering, Heyes learned, and for many (captivated by the picture of the self as a deep and hidden nature) it was also a means of self-discovery. In other words, there were real pleasures to be had in a practice that has often been construed as completely repressive and dehumanizing. Thus, in Heyes' very careful and creative analysis, this normalizing body-altering practice emerges as a site where a desire to care for the self is expressed and concentrated and where capacities for reflection, patient labor, self-control, and new forms of pleasure are produced, even as rigid norms are enforced and the pain of failure is intensified and reinvested in renewed efforts to conform. Agency not only persists within this set of regimes, but in some significant respects it is magnified and cultivated through them.

Heyes makes some similar points in her chapters on sex reassignment and cosmetic surgery. It is crucially important for feminists to understand these practices as something other than merely repressive, she argues, and to see those caught up in them as something other than mere dupes in need of rescue. She gives detailed descriptions of the ways in which these disciplines produce docility and rob people of effective means of critique and the imaginative alternatives that critique can engender, and she willingly admits that the networks of normalization that express themselves in these practices vastly exceed them, giving structure to a great deal -- perhaps most -- of our social and personal lives. But she refuses to believe that freedom is an impossibility for a normalized subject, and she marshals some impressive evidence to convince the reader that she is right.

The problem is not discipline per se, she tells us. Discipline does in fact produce new capacities of a variety of sorts, capacities for pleasure as well as pain, capacities that might open all sorts of new possibilities for the exercise of freedom. The problem lies, rather, with the goal of these particular disciplines or, perhaps more specifically, the fact that they tend to have a single, rigid goal, that of conformity to an ideal bodily appearance and comportment. Feminists have identified this goal (and the penalties associated with failure to attain it) as oppressive, and Heyes agrees. But practices of body transformation are not inevitably oppressive. Some practices of body transformation -- such as the yoga exercises that Heyes describes in the book's final chapter ("Somaesthetics for the Normalized Body") -- can open new possibilities and create new capacities without drawing a person more deeply into normalizing discourses that produce self-objectification, fear of deviation, and self-loathing. Disciplines of bodily transformation can transform self-understanding to make us less fearful of bodily difference and failure, less captivated by the images thrust upon us by advertising, fashion, and health industries, less apt to reinforce our society's gender norms in our own lives and the lives of those around us.

But it is not simply a matter of replacing dieting or cosmetic surgery with yoga or the Alexander Technique. It is a matter, first, of recognizing the desire for body/self transformation that regimes of normalization have produced and cultivated and the capacities for sustained self-discipline and self-reflection that individuals caught up in those regimes -- surely to some extent all of us -- are developing. And then it is a matter -- a feminist matter, Heyes argues -- of working through those regimes and discourses to open them up to unanticipated possibility. We can't honestly stand outside these normalizing regimes to condemn them. And even if we could, our condemnation would make no difference. What we can do is speak to the desires that they produce and engage with the capacities for pleasure in self-transformation that they capitalize upon. We can redirect disciplinary trajectories away from clichés of self-discovery -- the thin person inside screaming to get out or the man trapped in a woman's body -- toward the open ground of self-overcoming and creative self-stylization. We can't simply renounce our normalized selves, but we can discipline our way beyond at least some of the fingers of normalization's grasp to break the link between increased capacity and increased docility. Disciplines -- including both practices of critique and practices of body transformation -- can make us less docile, less obedient, less uncritical, and less afraid. And if we can become increasingly less of those things, who knows what else we might increasingly become? As Heyes puts it, "… one never knows, exactly, how one will be transformed…" (129). She says this about yoga, but her larger point is that this is true of any bodily discipline; to see and experience that truth, however, we must embrace the uncertainty instead of pre-labeling all but one chosen outcome as failures.

Heyes' book not only makes an important argument regarding feminist theory and strategy. It also addresses a controversial point in Foucault scholarship. Many scholars have seen a radical break in Foucault's work from the genealogies of power networks in the mid-1970s (Discipline and Punish, The History of Sexuality, Volume 1) to the last two volumes of the mid-1980s (The Use of Pleasure, The Care of the Self). In those last two works Foucault turns his attention away from the vast networks of biopower that produce subjectivity as subjection and toward the lives of free individuals and their life-shaping ethical choices. Some commentators have seen this shift as a radical departure, a retreat, or a betrayal (113). But Heyes contends that there is no discontinuity here at all. On the contrary, Foucault's account of subjectivity always included the possibility of resistance and uncertainty of outcome. Power networks are always unstable, he maintains, and subjects are almost always in a position to alter those networks to some degree by failing or refusing to repeat the patterns that define them. Foucault does not implicitly reject his work on biopower, then; his later work constitutes an effort to find ways in which subjects within regimes of power engage in self-transformative disciplines. Had he not died at the age of fifty-seven, he might well have moved beyond study of subjects in the ancient world to subjects in contemporary biopolitical networks. This is, in fact, exactly what Heyes herself does. Her book clearly brings together Foucault's work on biopower and normalization with his work on ethics and care of the self. Thus it constitutes, as well as makes, a powerful argument for her interpretation of Foucault's accounts of power and subjectivity in the 1970s and 1980s.

In sum, Cressida Heyes has produced a book that should be of great value to Foucault specialists as well as to feminist readers not well acquainted with Foucault. It is accessible and brief enough for undergraduate students, but original and compelling enough to hold the interest and perhaps spark the imaginations of professional philosophers and social theorists. This book deserves a place in every library.