Self, Value, and Narrative: A Kierkegaardian Approach

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Anthony Rudd, Self, Value, and Narrative: A Kierkegaardian Approach, Oxford University Press, 2012, 268pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199660049.

Reviewed by Rick Anthony Furtak, Colorado College


Anthony Rudd takes on an ambitious project, and he succeeds at making a major contribution to moral psychology and the theory of value. He examines how the self is formed in relation to what is taken to be good (or beautiful, or otherwise worthy), and makes an impressive attempt to defend the sort of robust value realism that is, as he concedes, hardly in accordance with most currently popular views (both within and outside of academic philosophy). Rudd is adept at translating the insights of Kierkegaard into the vocabulary of recent Anglophone philosophy, bringing him into conversation with Harry Frankfurt, Iris Murdoch, Charles Taylor, and others. His book is informed by an eclectic set of authors ranging from Plotinus to Ricoeur, and including psychoanalytic thinkers such as Jung. And yet the argument is conceptually organized and thematically driven so that Rudd's discussion is motivated by his own guiding concerns, and readers hear a single voice throughout. Self, Value, and Narrative achieves the all-too-rare feat of showing that a contribution to contemporary ethics need not confine itself to an artificially narrow set of conversation partners.

Opposing various critics of narrative self-understanding as a moral ideal, Rudd explains that character or personality is always being shaped as we engage with others. This ought to be uncontroversial. More significant is his claim that the self is not an entity to be studied by natural science, but a process: something that is always a work in progress, never finished. It is a "work" in the sense that we can "step back" from our feelings or commitments and ask ourselves whether to endorse them, whether they are appropriate or justified. We can also use this reflective space to consider how our desires, feelings, or dispositions may or may not "hang together" as parts of a coherent personality (231). What we find might include habits of mind that we would like to overcome, or even an unconscious yearning for a higher good -- for instance, a neglected possibility that we wish to pursue. And yet, the story of becoming oneself is not rightly seen as a project of self-constitution merely: there is also an element of "givenness," or facticity, and we must work out our relation to this as well (42-43). Rudd takes Sartre and Christine Korsgaard to task for overemphasizing self-choice -- the former almost to the exclusion of all else.

On the other hand, some accounts put stress on everything that is not established by our free decision, and Rudd rejects this kind of fatalism as well. It is Kierkegaard most of all who "helped me to understand the tension between the sense that we are responsible for shaping or authoring our own lives, and the sense that there is something . . . definite about ourselves that has to be accepted as simply given" (3). Rudd agrees with other Kierkegaardians such as Edward Mooney that this tension is clarified in the two volumes of Either/Or.[1] In this text, a young man commonly known as the "aesthete" refuses to commit himself to any of the possibilities that he longs to realize, while at the same time refusing to identify with anything concrete about his own history. He "cannot respond to the real, intrinsic value of things," nor can he regard the determinate aspects of his past "as a basis for the conscious shaping of [a] future," and this is why he suffers from a sense that his life is incoherent and meaningless (168-170). Such a person lacks any non-arbitrary criteria for orienting himself in the world, because nothing appears significant to him in an unambiguous or sustained way -- and this confusion about what is of value corresponds to a structural failing on the part of the subject.

In truth, Rudd explains, we are neither only our concrete facticity nor only our capacity for transcendence, and yet the difficulty in appreciating how we can be both at once gives rise to a tension in our thinking. Frankfurt, on his view, is inconsistent on this question, sounding at one time like a believer in acquiescent self-acceptance and at another like a believer in free self-shaping. In The Sickness unto Death, a notoriously dense text, Rudd finds -- quite rightly, in my opinion -- a more adequate conception of the human being as negotiating this tension. The capacity to step back and evaluate our commitments or desires might sound more tame than the dizzying sense of possibility that Kierkegaard portrays, but overall Rudd puts to good use the categories that he adopts from this psychological work of Kierkegaard's. Selfhood, he contends, consists in the conscious effort to shape oneself in accordance with one's values while also being mindful of all the unchosen conditions that place limits upon that shaping. It is comparable to how a wood sculptor is not imposing his or her vision on utterly amorphous material, but working "with the grain" (and sometimes against it). As Rudd argues, a person must ideally relate to what she has been and what she might be while also relating to pursuits that have real, intrinsic value. Frankfurt's notion of "final ends," or Bernard Williams's "ground projects," are pointing in the right direction, since they note the importance of unconditional commitment (44-45). However, Rudd thinks that we still need to be more specific about what it is to which one is committed. Invoking a Kierkegaardian work that is perhaps the most important of all for his own purposes, Rudd claims that "purity of heart" -- or, as Frankfurt would say, wholeheartedness -- "is to will one thing" (46). And he hastens to add that it is not sufficient to will just anything in order to develop a coherent identity (or, a unified self) and thus to live meaningfully. Rather, one must will the Good.

The central part of Rudd's book, which articulates his most original and provocative claims, focuses on personhood in relation to value, and makes a case for a "robust" form of axiological realism (he often calls it "evaluative" realism, although this term is potentially misleading). This is where he explains that the spelling of "the Good" with a capital "G" is intended in a very strong sense. He invites the reader to give a fair hearing to his defense of a broadly Platonic form of value realism. Although a more "metaphysically modest" value realism may achieve much of what his own theory is meant to accomplish, Rudd writes that "the view that the Good exists in its own right, apart from all particular goods, and that their goodness is somehow derived from the absolute goodness of The Good [sic], has real advantages" (146-147) over those more modest views. If we reject anti-realism about value, as many of us do, then we should in Rudd's view "look for an account of reality that makes value ontologically fundamental" (147-149), and this is what has led him to the position he now holds. Susan Wolf has noted that the need for a persuasive account of the reality of value is an unsolved problem in philosophy yet, Rudd says, she and other moral philosophers who oppose anti-realism seem too much at ease about leaving this problem unsolved. He points out that, for obvious reasons, it should be philosophically dissatisfying for a practicing moral realist to have no explanation of how values could fit into our picture of the world.

Knowing oneself requires knowing what one cares about, i.e., what one finds valuable -- or, to put the same point differently, personal identity is defined largely in terms of what matters to a person. And, as Rudd compellingly argues, I cannot regard whatever I value most as actually not mattering at all, regardless of what moral theory I might overtly endorse. This is because what it means to find something valuable is to recognize it "as having value in its own right" (87). Rudd cites Philippa Foot, who calls it "ludicrous" to regard it as a good thing if trees and tigers survived, or a bad thing if they ceased to exist; he points out that such a thought, far from being obviously ludicrous, is exactly what motivates many advocates of ecological preservation (122). And, he adds, one could legitimately believe that it would be a better state of affairs if certain plant or animal species did survive, simply because it is good that there should be such creatures. What about something like a musical octave, from middle C to high C -- isn't it at least conceivable that it's a good thing that it should exist? If so, consider two strings on a musical instrument, whose lengths differ by a ratio of 2:1, and which when plucked play the same note, one an octave higher than the other. Just as the ratio 2:1 has an intelligible reality that has its own validity apart from the empirical fact that one string on a particular instrument is (approximately) twice the length of another, so also the musical octave does not exist only when heard. Couldn't it have some intelligible reality apart from the strings on which it is played? This sort of example can make it seem as though there is nothing too metaphysically strange about supposing that "there is a transcendent Good which is the source of the value of particular good things," which is what Rudd defines as "strong Platonism" (145-154), although without any intention of invoking Plato's works except in a wide sense.

The few recent philosophers who have defended strong Platonism include theistic Platonists such as Robert Merrihew Adams, on whom Rudd often relies as he builds his own form of value realism. It is a tribute to Rudd's carefully formulated account that it made me want to look further into "strong Platonism," as he calls it. Apart from the question of whether he is right to put Kierkegaard's writings in this category,[2] Rudd makes it seem that a strong realism about "the Good" is far more credible than most of us would have assumed, and well worth taking seriously. There is, after all, no point of view available to us from which we can pronounce authoritatively that the way the world appears is a distortion of how it truly is (98, 126). This ought to make us want to accept a view that does justice to our experience of the world as mattering to us in various ways, a view according to which the facts about reality are not value-neutral and on which we can rationally ask ourselves if we are getting things right.

Nonetheless, a reader who wishes to affirm some form of value realism may have well-founded doubts about Rudd's position in certain respects. One reason for disagreement is simply that I could believe that meaning in life depends upon a relation to "something that is of value" (129-130), whether or not its value is recognized by anyone, and still consistently find that this gets us no further than "objectivity for us" -- maybe even that trying to go any further would lead us outside the bounds of sense. In Rudd's terminology, such a position qualifies as "weak Platonism" if it includes the belief that there are many good things but no transcendent Good (142). Rudd indicates that someone who accepts only this could still assent to much of his argument. Yet he prefers a view on which we can get the above phrase "for us" out of the equation.

Rudd is also at risk of being challenged by another kind of value realist, one who believes in the Good but does not conceive of it as a "real, objective" Good (94). He repeatedly pairs the terms "real" and "objective when referring to goodness or value that actually exists. Does "objective" add anything to "real," or does it function as a synonym repeated for emphasis? At times it seems as if either term used by itself meant the same thing: "objective" value is clearly "real" value, for Rudd. Yet the axiological realist I am imagining here could point out that what is objective should, trivially, be at least a possible object of knowledge (or experience) for some imaginable subject. And although he wants to "leave open the question" whether the Good is something that "we can fully know," or whether "our grasp of it will always remain partial" (93n38), Rudd at one point describes a moral saint, who may or may not exist (94n41), is entirely oriented toward the Good, and aware of "what are in fact the true values," apparently with no aspect of the Good remaining unknown to him or her (90-91).

Since Rudd thinks of the Good as "an ultimate source of value," which "is itself of absolute value" (149, 160), would it not seem hubristic to entertain the thought that the Good could perhaps be comprehensively known by any one of us, or by all of us collectively? After all, by virtue of being finite we cannot appreciate the distinctive worth of each and every person, place, activity, or abstract ideal, as it seems Rudd would wish to agree (132-134). This alone suggests that some aspects of the Good will remain veiled from any one of us. As for appreciating more of the Good collectively, this would be possible only insofar as our affinities differ, that is, insofar as each self responds to different aspects of the Good. And Rudd speaks of the importance of each person finding what aspects of the Good he or she has an "affinity for" (136-137, 248), which is in keeping with Kierkegaard's notion of each human being having a unique purpose. At the same time, Rudd sees "pluralism" as a threat to value realism (137, 144), and wishes to assert "the unity of value" in opposition to more pluralistic views (156-157). But if a moral agent ought to ask herself if her values are "the right ones" or "the true values," what room is there for a variety of moral agents to appreciate various aspects of the Good? For it is a vast and multifaceted Good that my imagined value realist has in mind, and the reality of goodness or value need not be compromised on such a view. This would represent an alternative form of moral realism to what Rudd considers the only option that gives value a solid ontological status.

Admittedly, what I'm outlining is only a sketch with many details remaining to be filled in, and it's all too easy to gesture toward a rival theory in response to a philosopher who has worked out his own position more completely. It seems to me that there must be a way to explain the existence of real value -- not of our own invention -- without factoring the subject (or a plurality of subjects) out of account. "I can't know it" does not entail "it isn't there to be known" in matters of value any more than in other cases. Nevertheless, these points of disagreement arise out of deeply shared (if non-identical) intuitions, which Rudd's book has reinforced. His elegantly argued conception of selfhood and value will provoke and inspire, through its challenge to prevailing views as well as the possibilities it offers for moral philosophy.

[1] See especially Chapter 2, "Self-Choice or Self-Reception," of Mooney's Selves in Discord and Resolve (Routledge, 1996). Rudd's interpretation of Either/Or is also predominantly in line with the reading developed in Chapters 6 & 7 of Wisdom in Love by Rick Anthony Furtak (Notre Dame, 2005).

[2] Earlier, Rudd acknowledges that, for Kierkegaard, "what the Good means concretely will differ for each individual," hardly a Platonic view; yet he asserts that "Kierkegaard . . . follows Plato in seeing the Good as . . . distinct from particular goods," and also that Kierkegaard "goes on to identify the Good with God" (45-47). As a general statement about Kierkegaard's corpus, this can be justified only through a highly selective reading: for "the Good" is not one of the "divine names" most often used by Kierkegaard, nor is it the term that Kierkegaard says is the only substantive word that can refer to God (that would be "love"), so what Rudd says here seems liable to leave his reader with a false impression. For Kierkegaard, we do not simply relate to God as to an object. My reason for leaving this comment in a note is that I think what matters most, in light of the aims of this book, isn't whether Rudd is right about Kierkegaard but whether he is right about self, narrative, and value.