Selfless Minds: A Contemporary Perspective on Vasubandhu’s Metaphysics

Selfless Minds

Monima Chadha, Selfless Minds: A Contemporary Perspective on Vasubandhu’s Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2023, 222pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192844095.

Reviewed by Jay L Garfield, Smith College/ Harvard University


Monima Chadha has given the world of Anglophone philosophy more reason to take Indian Buddhist philosophy seriously in this closely argued study of the philosophy of the 4th century philosopher Vasubandhu, generally regarded as one of the founders (with his older brother Asaṅga) of the Yogācāra tradition, a tradition associated sometimes with idealism, and sometimes with phenomenology. However one reads the vast literature of this school—or, more specifically, the work of Vasubandhu himself—the close attention that Vasubandhu and his followers give to the philosophy of mind and the structure of subjectivity is inescapable and fascinating. Vasubandhu’s influence on subsequent Buddhist philosophy in India, Tibet, China, and beyond is incalculable, and he is surely one of the two or three most important philosophers in the Indian Buddhist tradition. An investigation of his work by an astute philosopher at home in contemporary philosophy of mind is hence most welcome.

And there is a lot to like in Chadha’s account. She does not attempt a broad survey of Vasubandhu’s corpus (but, as I will suggest below, this may have been a mistake), or of the many issues he addresses in that corpus. Instead, she focuses on his account of cognition in the context of the Buddhist doctrine of selflessness in his Treasury of Metaphysics and its auto-commentary (Abhidharmakośa and the Abhidharmakośa-bhāsya). This magisterial scholastic text explains in great detail the philosophical position of the direct realist Vaibhāsika school in the root verses, and then in the auto commentary criticizes that position from the perspective of the representationalist Sautrāntika school.

This text is taken by canonical Buddhist scholars and contemporary scholars of Buddhist studies alike as the clearest window into the doctrines of these important Buddhist philosophical schools, and as a stepping-stone to the Mahāyāna schools that were to follow. It is a rich mine of Buddhist ideas regarding how cognition works, and regarding the structure of experience. Chadha explores this lode with skill, developing original interpretations and interesting philosophical problems for Vasubandhu and for Buddhist philosophy more generally. She ably brings this text into conversation with contemporary philosophy of mind. Nonetheless, there are some difficulties with her account.

The first chapter presents a nice overview of, and introduction to, Abhidharma philosophy and its concerns. This chapter provides useful context for the reader not already steeped in Buddhist philosophy for the discussions that are to follow. The account is middle-of-the-road and not at all tendentious. Chapter 2 introduces the reader to the Buddhist no-self view, and to Buddhist debates with Orthodox Indian philosophers (Chadha focuses on those of the Nyāya-Vaiśesika school) regarding the reality of the self.

This chapter, unlike the first, has an axe to grind, although Chadha is not explicit about this. Although there is reasonable unanimity regarding the fact that Vasubandhu—like all Buddhist philosophers—rejects the reality of the self, Chadha also claims that he rejects the reality of the conventional person. And this is controversial. Jonathan Gold (2015) and Oren Hanner (2016) have argued persuasively that Vasubandhu does endorse a conventionally real person, and that this position plays a critical role in his understanding of agency, subjectivity, and ethical life. What is more, they provide crucial textual evidence for this attribution, and show how it coheres with the positions adopted in other texts by Vasubandhu. Chadha cites as evidence for her no-person reading Vasubandhu’s critique of the Pudgalavāda (Personalist) position (42). But this is at best inconclusive: the Pudgalavādins argued that the person is an emergent entity, independent of convention, and that it has independent causal power. She is correct that Vasubandhu rejects those claims; but this is not to reject the claim that there is no conventionally real person. While Chadha cites Mark Siderits (1997, 2014) and Jonardon Ganeri (2007) in support of this position, neither of them actually concur with the view that Vasubandhu rejects persons, and she does not engage with the more directly relevant, and more philologically authoritative, work of Gold and Hanner.

This is important because, as Chadha herself emphasizes, the claim that Vasubandhu denies even that persons are real is one of the more distinctive contributions this book makes, setting her reading apart from those offered in most contemporary Buddhist philosophical literature. And it is this claim that sets up the problems regarding synchronic and diachronic unity, subjectivity, and agency with which the remainder of the book is concerned. Each of these problems—as Chadha concedes—is easier to solve if Vasubandhu can appeal to a conventionally real person as the locus of unity, subjectivity, agency, and responsibility. So, one would have expected a more detailed textual defense of this original reading. Moreover, the pattern established here of inattention to some of the most important literature on Vasubandhu, and in particular to those who have offered contrary interpretations, continues throughout the book.

The third chapter introduces the Abhidharma framework for understanding the structure of experience. The chapter is accurate and clear, if under-documented. While Chadha’s account is accessible, it would have been nice for the modern reader to see how these doctrines are expressed and developed in Buddhist Abhidharma texts themselves. And there is an important expository gap in the chapter that—while not an inaccuracy—could lead to confusion among those not already familiar with the history of these doctrines: Up to this point in the book, Chadha, following the program of the Treasury and its auto-commentary, has been focusing on pre-Mahāyāna Abhidharma schools. At this point, however, introducing the ālaya-vijñāna (foundation consciousness), she shifts her attention to the Yogācāra school, without alerting the reader to this important doctrinal shift (71–73).

This is important because Vasubandhu’s Yogācāra account of subjectivity—developed in texts that Chadha does not discuss (Treatise in 30 Stanzas, Treatise in 20 Stanzas, Treatise on the Three Natures)—is importantly different from that developed in the Treasury and its auto-commentary. Sonam Kachru (2021) illustrates this point beautifully in his book on the 20 Stanzas. Attention to this difference and to these other important texts by Vasubandhu in which he articulates his Yogācāra account of subjectivity would have deepened the discussion of the Treasury account, and so would have provided a more well-rounded account of Vasubandhu’s contributions. Moreover, Chadha’s account of the structure, function, and role of the foundation consciousness is thin. Attention to the work of Gold (2015), Daniel Lusthaus (2002) or William Waldron (2003)—each of whom have explored this construct and its role in Yogācāra accounts of experience in great detail—would have deepened the account considerably (and would have raised important interpretative questions regarding Chadha’s no-person reading of Vasubandhu).

Chapter 4 is a creative piece of reconstructive history of philosophy. Here Chadha ably constructs an account of episodic memory on behalf of the Abhidharma tradition as a reply to Nyāya arguments that the self is required for such an account. She draws on recent work on episodic memory. The account she proposes is satisfying, and comports well with the Buddhist position that, as she felicitously puts it, “the reality of our lives is an active construction or controlled hallucination, rather than passive perception” (97). I was surprised, however, to see an absence of attention to the account that actual later Yogācāra philosophers such as Dignāga and Dharmakīrti offer to the Nyāya challenge in their accounts of reflexive awareness, or the critiques of the reflexive awareness doctrine advanced by their Mādhyamika opponent Candrakīrti, particularly as this dispute has been central to a good deal of recent debate in the philosophy of mind (Garfield 2021a, Thompson 2014, Zahavi 2005), literature that Chadha cites elsewhere. It is also surprising that Chadha, while providing her own reconstruction of an appropriate reply to the Nyāya position neither considers Vasubandhu’s own positive account of memory in the Treasury, nor mentions Matthew Kapstein’s (2001) very detailed, textually grounded discussion of that account.

Chapter 5 is a very solid discussion defending the ability of the Abhidharma tradition to respond to Nyāya challenges to provide an account of synchronic identity without a self. Chapter 6, on the phenomenology of agency, is more problematic, and again suffers from lack of attention to other relevant literature on the topic. In this chapter, Chadha discusses the status of moral agency and responsibility in the context of no self (and—as she represents Vasubandhu’s position—no person, either). This is territory explored in great detail, and in different ways, by Gold (2015) and Hanner (2016). Each develops a nuanced account of Vasubandhu’s views on action, its relation to intention, to karma, and of his understanding of agency in the absence of a self. Each argues persuasively—both on philosophical and on textual grounds—that Vasubandhu attributes agency at the personal level grounded in a causal story at the sub-personal level, and that cetanā (intention) plays a crucial causal and analytical role in the explanation of action. Their accounts call into question Chadha’s no-person reading, and so she needs to reckon with them to sustain her own interpretation.

Chadha argues that Vasubandhu, having denied the reality of any entity that could serve as an agent, develops a no-agency view of action. But she provides no direct textual evidence for this attribution beyond a quotation from the Treasury that demonstrates that Vasubandhu does not ascribe agency to a self. Nor does she address Gold’s or Hanner’s arguments in favor of a reading according to which Vasubandhu makes sense of personal agency at the conventional level, while explaining it causally at the sub-personal level. Moreover, in this chapter she asserts that Vasubandhu introduced the foundation consciousness to explain the relation of actions to resultant karma. This is false. The foundation consciousness appears both in the Samdhinirmocana-sūtra (the Discourse Unraveling the Buddha’s Intent), which almost certainly predates Vasubandhu, and in the Yogācārabhumi (Stages of the Yogācāra Path), composed by Asanga probably before Vasubandhu composed the Treasury. And while it is deployed to explain the workings of karma, its principal motivation in those contexts and in Vasubandhu’s 30 Stanzas is the explanation of how it is that dualistic consciousness arises in the absence of external objects.

Chapter 7, in which Chadha defends the cogency of the view that our cognitive states have no owner, is the best chapter in this book and repays close study. Relying on recent work in cognitive science and the philosophy of mind, Chadha argues both that there is no clear phenomenology of ownership to which one might appeal to defend the reality of an owner and that even if there were, there would be no reason to take any such experience as veridical. She points out that while Vasubandhu’s view is both radical and counterintuitive, it is also plausible and difficult to refute. This chapter is not heavy on textual analysis, but it is very carefully argued.

Chapter 8, on Buddhist reductionism, addresses the relation between Vasubandhu’s view of the relation between the sub-personal and the personal levels of description and that of Derek Parfit in Reasons and Persons (1984). Chadha argues that Vasubandhu shares Parfit’s reductionism, but that they differ in that while Parfit is not an eliminativist regarding persons, Vasubandhu is. Whether or not one agrees with Chadha’s ascription of eliminativism, she owes the reader—if she is to defend this account in this context—a discussion of Hanner’s (2016) extensive and meticulous consideration of the connection between Vasubandhu’s and Parfit’s views. But once again, we find no discussion of this at least highly plausible and textually grounded contrary position. More surprisingly, Chadha ignores Parfit’s own discussions of what he sees as the relation between his position and Buddhist accounts (1987, 1995).

Chadha also claims in this chapter that Buddhists do not recommend giving up self-concern or special concern for our loved ones (173). This runs contrary to the content of the most important Buddhist ethical texts—Buddhaghosa’s Visuddhimagga (Path of Purification) and Śāntideva’s Bodhicāryāvatāra (How to Lead an Awakened Life). These texts each defend a no-self view akin to that Vasubandhu defends, and each—in the context of an articulation of an ethical framework built around the four divine states (brahmavihāras)—argues for an ethical vision that de-centers the agent and that rejects special concern. While Chadha cites Buddhaghosa’s meditation techniques that begin with the presupposition of self-regarding attitudes (174), she neglects to point out that the point of these exercises is not to endorse, but to begin with and eventually to expunge this orientation (Garfield 2021b, Heim 2020).

The final chapter addresses the Buddhist path. One might think that to practice a temporally extended path aimed at awakening and the elimination of suffering would require there to be temporally extended persons, even if those persons are selfless. As I have indicated, most scholars take Vasubandhu and his colleagues to adopt such a position. Chadha does not address this issue, which I take to be a serious challenge to her reading. She does, however, raise what she takes to be two serious problems for the value of the path itself. First, she claims that “the bodhisattva vow is a commitment to give up one’s own well-being and enlightenment for the sake of others” (188). This is false. As Stephen Jenkins (1998) has argued, and as Śāntideva emphasizes in How to Lead an Awakened Life, the bodhisattva is taken in Buddhist ethical texts to gain at least as much from their practice as those whom their actions benefit. Bodhisattva practice is uniformly taken to be joyful in Buddhist ethical texts. And far from giving up their enlightenment, the Bodhisattva vow is a vow specifically to attain full awakening, or Buddhahood, in order to be of maximum benefit to sentient beings. Chadha simply hasn’t done her homework in Buddhist ethics.

Second, Chadha argues, following Susan Wolf (1982) and Thomas Nagel (1989), that the bodhisattva path is simply too demanding because it requires us to give up on too many of our personal projects in order to commit ourselves to the project of relieving suffering, thereby robbing our lives of the joys that make them worth living. This critique might seem compelling to anyone antecedently convinced that the temporal pleasures deriving from pursuing personal ends or satisfying personal preferences are intrinsically valuable and constitutive of true happiness. But to anyone persuaded by a Buddhist analysis of suffering and its causes, it must sound patently question-begging. This is because it valorizes attraction, which is one of the principal causes of suffering, and which is to be eradicated. Śāntideva puts the point nicely when he says that seeking pleasure in the world of samsara is like licking honey from a razor blade (How to Lead an Awakened Life 7.64). To the extent that one is convinced that suffering is truly bad, and that there is an imperative to relieve it, all other ends are simply egocentric and superficial. While Chadha might be able to advance this argument, unless she engages with the fundamental Buddhist analysis of the human condition, she simply misses her target. I suspect that deeper reflection on the structure and importance of the path and its relation to the four noble truths would have led her to reconsider her reading of Vasubandhu.

For all of its problems, this is a rich and rewarding book. I recommend it to those interested in how Indian Buddhist philosophy and contemporary philosophy of mind can be brought together in philosophical conversation, and that should be anyone in our profession. Its strengths are in its serious engagement with both traditions and in its consistent concern with solving philosophical problems, rather than with “comparing” traditions or retelling ancient history. It falters principally in its inattention to the wealth of other literature on this topic. In Chadha’s acknowledgments none of the principal contemporary scholars of Yogācāra thought are credited. Consultation with those who have devoted decades of thought to this school would also have helped to add nuance to her account. Serious attention to the contemporary literature on Vasubandhu and Yogācāra thought might have either led her to revise some of her positions or it might have helped her to make her case more persuasively. As a result of this negligence, for all of its virtues, this book suffers from having been written as though in an intellectual vacuum. To address Vasubandhu’s work philosophically in conversation with contemporary philosophy of mind is to be applauded; to ignore the work of so many eminent Vasubandhu scholars and so much relevant literature is to be regretted.


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