Sellars and Contemporary Philosophy

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David Pereplyotchik and Deborah R. Barnbaum (eds.), Sellars and Contemporary Philosophy, Routledge, 2017, 263pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138670624.

Reviewed by Ray Brassier, American University of Beirut


David Pereplyotchik and Deborah Barnbaum's collection devoted to Sellars is the fourth to appear since 2016 (an indication that Sellars has more readers now than during his lifetime).[1] It is an outstanding collection that perfectly encapsulates what is at stake in Sellars' contemporary resurgence. None of its contributors are content with exegesis: each uses Sellars to intervene in ongoing debates about the nature of mind, meaning, knowledge, and action, as well as the relation between appearance and reality. Its uniform excellence is due not only to the quality of its content but also to the fact that it has been superbly edited. Each chapter marshals its arguments with exemplary economy; claims and counter-­‐claims are cross-referenced along with recurring themes to ensure constructive interaction. The result is a volume that succeeds in casting genuinely new light on Sellars' thought.

The book is divided into sections on 'Ethics, Moral Reasoning and Free Will' (Part I), 'Philosophy of Language and Mind' (Part II), and 'Metaphysics and Epistemology' (Part III). Its fourth and final section is the transcription of an author-meets-critics session in which Willem deVries and James O'Shea respond to Robert Brandom's From Empiricism to Expressivism: Brandom Reads Sellars. Rather than recapitulating the contents of each chapter individually, I will try to highlight what I take to be the book's fundamental themes.

In Part I, O'Shea and Jeremy Randel Koons foreground the crucial role of practical reason in Sellars' system. O'Shea shows how Sellars takes up Kant's distinction between Willkür and Wille, or heteronymous freedom of choice and the autonomous moral will. Since it is espousals of principle that are reflected in uniformities of performance, not principles themselves (granting norms causal efficacy would be a kind of supernaturalism), one must be endowed with the proper dispositions in order to be able to do the right thing. Thus there is a sense in which, properly understood, heteronymy is the condition of autonomy: we must be able to choose to will unconditionally. This also points to the relation of reciprocal presupposition between communal oughts and individual intentions. Koons argues that the former are irreducible to the latter: we-intentions cannot be derived from individual intentions; they alone are categorically binding. But Sellars is unsure whether some more ultimate rational ground underwrites the reasonableness of we-intentions. Since intending is inseparable from reasoning, there would be such a ground if the community indexed by we-intentions is to encompass all rational beings. The problem lies in establishing the universal scope of this 'we'. Koons cites the following passage from Science and Metaphysics:

  1. To think of oneself as rational being is (implicitly) to think of oneself as subject to epistemic oughts binding on rational beings generally.
  2. The intersubjective intention to promote epistemic welfare implies the intersubjective intention to promote welfare sans phrase.[2]

It is the difficulty of securing the second premise, i.e., the link between epistemic and general welfare, which casts doubt on the notion that the interests of all rational beings must converge towards the common good. O'Shea and Koons show how, for Sellars as for Kant, practical reason orients theoretical reason. The unanswered question concerns the limits of the orienting horizon: is it empirically bounded (by biology, history, or culture)? Or is it, as the young Marx thought, the horizon of 'free conscious activity' as a new, empirically unbounded genus of being?

This question underlies the issue of the theoretical relation between the manifest and scientific images, one of the recurring themes throughout the rest of the volume. In their contributions, Michael Hicks and Kevin Fink identify serious flaws in Sellars' accounts of thought and sensation within the manifest image. Hicks detects an equivocation between invention and discovery in Sellars' myth of genius Jones. Its source is the double nature of normative function. The latter is at once logical and social: inferential function is constituted through socially acknowledged authority and responsibility. But given this intimate link between normative function and social acknowledgement, how can thoughts possess normative statuses independently of socially acknowledged practices? Sellars' realism requires that Jones discover covert thoughts as the (initially) imperceptible constituents of overt utterances. Prior to Jones's discovery, we had thoughts but were not aware of having them. But Jones' discovery requires that the normative structure of thought not be co-extensive with the normative structure of meaningful utterances; otherwise, Jones has invented thoughts by convincing his fellows to bestow this normative structure upon them. Hicks formulates the difficulty as follows: "How can Sellars be realistic about the normative articulation of episodes that can only be acknowledged via Jones's theoretical innovation, while also maintaining that such acknowledgement is crucial to their normative articulation?" (p. 72) On Hicks' account, this inconsistency underlies the tension between Sellars' claim (in 'Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind') that genius Jones must postulate covert thoughts to explain overt speech, and his subsequent claim (in 'Language as Thought and Communication') that overt verbal behaviour is already an instance of thinking.[3] If verbal behaviour is already thinking, the claim that overt speech provides the observable model for covert thought-episodes, with the latter being postulated to explain the former, is circular.

Faced with this dilemma, Sellars can try to dispel the circle by embracing nativism and the language of thought hypothesis, thereby dissolving the tension between the covert normativity of thought and the overt normativity of linguistic behaviour -- but at the cost of separating normative function from social acknowledgement. Or he can follow Hicks' recommendation, which is to recognize that if, by Sellars' own lights, verbal behaviour is already the direct manifestation of covert thought, Jones need not give an account of meaning devoid of reference to covert thought or try to use that account as a model for the latter. All that Sellars need do is acknowledge that appropriate non-­‐verbal responses to overt utterances are already instances of covert conceptual understanding and hence of thinking. If Hicks is right, the mistake is to think that the normative articulation of thought is required to supplement that of language: they are indissociable.

Fink develops an analogous critique of Sellars' account of colour. In Sellars' myth, genius Jones relocates colours from the physical to the sensory realm by re-categorising them as states of perceivers rather than properties of objects. But Sellars also maintains that the determination of colour content depends on causal laws correlating perceiver and perceived: phenomenal invariancies presuppose physical invariancies; there can be no phenomenal law without physical law. As Fink puts it, "In the absence of their physical property analogues, our concepts of sense impressions of colour cannot be given any definite content." (p.151) By relocating colour to the sensory realm, Jones' theory deprives us of the material invariancies required to give content to our concepts of colour. As with Hicks, Fink's argument suggests that Jones' postulation draws upon the conceptual structure of the manifest world in a way that ultimately compromises the coherence of the postulate. Both their contributions expose an equivocation between scientific postulation and manifest correlation in Sellars' presentation of Jones' method. They also point towards the indispensability of the manifest object world.

In this regard, their chapters resonate with those of deVries and Danielle Macbeth, both of whom reject Sellars' claim that the manifest image stands to the scientific image as appearance stands to reality. Citing Sellars' espousal of the Platonic edict that to be is to make a difference, deVries argues that Sellars cannot maintain (as he clearly does) that practical commitments to manifest kinds make a difference while denying (as he also does) that those kinds really exist. For deVries, Sellars' insight into the social basis of normativity implies a commitment to practical realism, understood as realism about the manifest realm as the domain of normative prescription. Similarly, Macbeth proposes that there are what she calls 'natural truths', which correspond to

the idea that some truths, while not the same for (that is available to be grasped by) all rational beings -- as the truths of mathematics and fundamental physics are -- are nevertheless valid for (available to) all human beings, all rational beings with our sort of body and form of sensibility. (p.173)

Macbeth argues that our ability to know natural truth implies that we are answerable to things as they are, not just as they appear to be. In insisting that manifest phenomena are mere appearances, Sellars falls prey to what she calls 'the myth of the taken': "the myth that in the end our thinking is answerable only to things as we take them to be" (p.179), rather than as they really are. On Macbeth's account, Sellars' noumenal scientific realism is unviable because it entails the implausible claim that there are no natural truths.

The contributions by Huw Price and Robert Brandom seem to compound the case against Sellars' dualism of images. Price argues against what he calls 'the Bifurcation Thesis': the claim that there is a principled semantic distinction to be drawn between descriptive and non-descriptive discourse. No such distinction can be made because the relevant difference is pragmatic, not semantic. Sellars saw this and partly captured the required distinction by distinguishing between truth as semantic assertibility and truth as picturing. But Sellars' conviction that truth as assertion could somehow be anchored in picturing is a metaphysical relapse. If, as Price maintains, the distinction between description and expression is pragmatic, then it is a category mistake to believe that one variety of linguistic practice could ground another. Price accepts Sellars' distinction between semantic and pictorial truth but proposes to recast it as a distinction between two species of representation: i-representation (signification) and e-representation (picturing). For Price (as for Brandom), e-representations are necessarily embedded within i-representations because the resources we use to state empirical facts (physical, biological, psychological) presuppose those we use to state non-empirical facts (ethical, aesthetic, modal, etc.) The metaphysical temptation consists in thinking that one form of practice corresponds to reality while another does not. However, it is not clear that Sellars succumbed to this particular temptation. Whatever else is wrong with it, Sellars' view that rational-semantic truth is anchored in matter-of-factual correspondences between linguistic tokenings and non-linguistic objects is not equivalent to the claim that expressive practice is grounded in pictorial practice. Picturing is not a practice: it is something done by representings, not something we do by representing.

Brandom's contribution singles out categories and noumena as the two Kantian axes of Sellars' thought. Categories explicate the practices deployed in describing and explaining: they allow us to say what we are doing in using ordinary empirical-descriptive vocabulary. This is Sellars' good idea. His bad idea is his neo-­‐ Kantian conviction that manifest phenomena stand to scientific noumena as appearance to reality. Unfortunately, Brandom's argument against this latter claim is not included in his chapter. This is regrettable because both the chapter by Dionysis Christias and the discussion that makes up the volume's concluding section are attempts to respond to it. Brandom's argument is disarmingly simple. To identify manifest object A with scientific object B requires identifying all of A's empirical descriptive properties with B's. But this includes modal properties: all of A's modal properties (all the subjunctive conditionals true of A) must be identical with all of B's modal properties (all the subjunctive conditionals true of B). But manifest objects and scientific objects fall under different descriptive sortals with different criteria of identity and individuation. Identifying them would require strongly cross-sortal identities. Such sortals differ in the non-monotonic subjunctive conditionals that govern their application. Thus they cannot be identified.

Brandom regards Sellars' claim that manifest phenomena are appearances of scientific noumena as a symptom of 'object naturalism'. Object naturalism is naturalism about the objects and properties that a vocabulary allows us to think and talk about; how it represents the objective world as being. By way of contrast, 'subject naturalism' is a pragmatic naturalism that seeks "a naturalistic account of the discursive practices of using the target vocabulary as meaningful in the way it is meaningful. Rather than a naturalistic semantic metavocabulary, the subject naturalist seeks a naturalistic pragmatic metavocabulary." (Brandom, From Empiricism to Expressivism, p.91, my emphasis)

How is a naturalistic pragmatic metavocabulary supposed to yield an account of the use of a descriptive vocabulary "as meaningful in the way it is meaningful"? Answering this requires an account of the distinction between semantic and pragmatic inference. One can give a reason by doing something as well as by saying something. The pragmatic ratification of inferential necessity between assertions is not the same as the conceptual ratification of necessary connections between objects: what is being done by saying is not the same as what is being said. Moreover, what is implied by saying (pragmatic inference) differs from what is implied by what is said (semantic inference). By the same token, what is implied by saying what one is doing is not the same as what is implied by just saying it. From a Sellarsian perspective, pragmatic inferences are the practical codification of the rule-governed patterns of behavior that generate concepts. Brandom's insistence that a pragmatic metavocabulary explicates a descriptive vocabulary "as meaningful in the way it is meaningful" threatens to insulate rule-governed activity from its pattern-governed behavioral obverse. The problem with Brandom's argument is not that it fails but that it proves too much. It implies that the practice of giving and asking for reasons is a genus whose specification into different descriptive vocabularies results in discretely segmented (and non-communicating) regions of description and explanation: there are as many different explanations as vocabularies. But if Sellars's claim (also endorsed by Brandom) that "the resources of description and explanation advance hand in hand" holds for discursive practices in general, then it is implausible to insulate descriptive vocabularies against explanatory incursions from other vocabularies (compare attempts to insulate occult or religious vocabularies from other regions of discourse).

All saying is a kind of doing, but we do not always already know how to say what we are doing when we say something. Sellars' Kantian postulation of non-conceptual representings to explain why conceptual representings obtain should not be so quickly dismissed as an instance of object naturalism. Instead, it should be understood as part of an attempt to describe and explain the varieties of doing involved in saying independently of our own current understanding of what we are doing. Thus describing and explaining conceptual representings (intendings) is not just a matter of explicitation but of deliberate conceptual transformation. In Sellars own words: "The motto of the age of science might well be: Natural philosophers have hitherto sought to understand 'meanings'; the task is to change them."[4] In seeking to describe and explain meanings, scientific explanation re-categorizes manifest concepts, thereby changing our understanding of what such concepts do. This is a point well-made by Christias:

scientific image kind terms . . . explain manifest image terms by changing their very meaning, thereby reconceptualizing -- or even recategorizing -- the latter in their descriptive and explanatory dimensions on the basis of analogically construed successor or counterpart concepts. (p. 189)

Thus, Christias argues, Sellars' transcendental scientific realism is not about identifying manifest and scientific referents but about re-categorising manifest senses, and, since extensions are limiting cases of intensions, reconceiving their referents. The scientific concepts that succeed manifest concepts are generically similar but specifically different from their predecessors. It is precisely in order to preserve the normative ideals proper to the descriptive and explanatory practices underlying our use of manifest sortals that we must transform both their sense and their reference. Manifest sortals are to be replaced by scientific sortals insofar as the latter provide better explanations of their functioning. In his response to Brandom, O'Shea echoes Christias by pointing out that Sellars' account of conceptual change postulates the embedding of function within function (dot-quoting dot-quoted expressions). Conceptual transformation involves a process of recursion wherein generic function is retained by jettisoning specific function: this is what Sellars calls "theoretical identification by counterpart reconceptualization." (p. 235)[5]

Here Christias and O'Shea point towards what Boris Brandhoff calls Sellars' 'metatheoretical functionalism'. Brandoff argues that Sellars is concerned with language as a system of functional roles constituted by an ideally coherent system of norms. Thus the 'formal' in the received (Carnapian) sense is a limiting case of the functional. Perhaps the fundamental issue dividing the contributors to this volume is whether the relevant ideal of coherence is best specified using our manifest or our scientific understanding. The contributions by Pereplyotchik and Carl Sachs explore the latter possibility by extending Sellars' functionalism into the sub-personal and ethological domains. Taking up Sellars' 'extended interpretation' of dot-quotation to include non-linguistic functional analogues, Pereplyotchik proposes that mental phrase markers and mental syntactic rules be viewed as sub-personal analogues of ordinary and auxiliary positions in a language game. Adopting a more ethological perspective, Sachs draws on enactivist cognitive science to challenge the transcendental status of the productive imagination in Sellars' philosophy of perception. Its epistemological role, which is to construct sense-image models of external objects, is better realized by the sensorimotor abilities through which organisms selectively apprehend features of their environment. The contents of perceptual experiences are not phenomenal episodes but relational affordances. Thus Sachs argues against Sellars' Kantian bifurcation between the receptivity of sense and the guidedness of intuition.[6] The transcendental role Sellars accords the productive imagination is a concession to the given: sensorimotor function can account for its genesis.

In the book's concluding discussion, Brandom suggests that Sellars fallaciously infers from the premise that normative and modal vocabulary plays an expressive rather than descriptive role to the conclusion that it plays no descriptive role whatsoever (p. 221) What we do when we say (in a pragmatic meta-language) what we are doing in saying (in the object-language) is not what we are doing when describing objects. But according to Brandom this does not entail that saying what we do when we describe is not an instance of describing. His suggestion is that this non sequitur underwrites Sellars' irrealism about the manifest domain, as revealed by his metalinguistic nominalism and his insistence that reality ultimately consists of particulars, not facts. This is a characteristically insightful objection. But it is not clear to me how saying in a pragmatic meta-language what one is doing in an object language (e.g. ratifying an inference) can also be a case of doing what one is saying in the object-language (e.g. describing an object).

Pragmatism insists that our understanding of the world is conditioned by our interest in changing it. What distinguishes Sellars from his pragmatist precursors is not his naturalism but his nominalism, which is his concession to materialism: "propositional form belongs only in the conceptual order."[7] Sellars' attention to the ways in which non-conceptual representings shape conceptual order is a symptom of this materialism. His Rortyan heirs have sought to align his coupling of normative function and social practice with an orientation towards liberal democracy. But emphasis on the social basis of normativity also points towards two other, radically divergent alternatives: Heidegger's phenomenological interpretation of our pre-theoretical understanding of being-in-the-world; or Marx's materialist explanation of the historically generated economic practices subtending our everyday lifeworld. Needless to say, this bifurcation is politically charged. But to reject it is also to take a political stance, as Rorty does when portraying liberal ironism as the enlightened antidote to totalitarian temptation. But if we accept Sellars' rejection of what he called "the whole framework of givenness", then we ought to reject the ironist's assumption that we implicitly understand the social practices in which we engage. Sellars' materialism harbours an under-appreciated dialectical aspect: it invites us to investigate the sub-personal (neurobiological) as well as supra-personal (socio-historical) processes through which sociality has become entwined with normativity. Sellars' attentiveness to the former has been widely acknowledged: it is of a piece with his commitment to scientific explanation. But with regard to the latter, the thinker with whom he might be most fruitfully paired is neither Heidegger nor Dewey but Marx.

[1] The others are Wilfrid Sellars, Idealism, and Realism: Understanding Psychological Nominalism, edited by Patrick J. Reider (Bloomsbury Academic 2016); Sellars and His Legacy, edited by James R. O'Shea (Oxford University Press 2016); The Legacy of Kant in Sellars and Meillassoux: Analytic and Continental Kantianism, edited by Fabio Gironi (Routledge 2017).

[2] Science and Metaphysics: Variations on Kantian Themes, New York and London: Routledge and Kegan Paul Ltd, 1968, p. 225.

[3] See 'Language as Thought and as Communication' Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 29, No. 4 (Jun., 1969), p. 527.

[4] 'Counterfactuals, Dispositions, and the Causal Modalities'. In: H. Feigl, M. Scriven, and M. Grover, eds. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume II: Concepts, Theories, and the Mind-Body Problem (Minneapolis, University of Minnesota Press), §86.

[5] Nevertheless, O'Shea also concurs with Brandom, deVries, Macbeth and Price in rejecting noumenal scientific realism (the expression is originally O'Shea's).

[6] See Science and Metaphysics, p. 16

[7] Naturalism and Ontology, p. 62