Sellars and His Legacy

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James R. O'Shea (ed.), Sellars and His Legacy, Oxford University Press, 2016, 266pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198766872.

Reviewed by William Rottschaefer, Lewis and Clark College


This collection of essays by eminent Sellars scholars all (save for one) derive from a Sellars Centenary Conference held at University College Dublin in 2012 and organized by James R. O'Shea. The conference reminds one of a family reunion honoring a parent. And, not untypically, these heirs of Sellars have different views about their progenitor and different takes about not only what his legacy is, but also about its successes and failures. The honoring is manifested more in dissent from rather than in agreement with the parent. The volume reflects another feature of some family reunions: siblings sometimes don't talk to each very much and sometimes don't get along.

Notoriously, the descendants of Sellars are divided between the so-called Left-Wing and Right-Wing Sellarsians. Roughly, the Left-Wingers deplore Sellars' appeals to science and scientific realism, his "scientism", while the Right-Wingers endorse it. In addition, Left-Wingers have tended to explore the veins of Sellars thought in detail while Right-Wingers have taken Sellars "scientism" and run with it, using it to advance his synoptic project, the uniting of manifest and scientific images of "man-in-the-world". (Full disclosure: I count myself a Right-Wing Sellarsian.)

Providing a very helpful introduction, O'Shea first notes Sellars' place in the pantheon of 20th century analytic philosophers and some of his groundbreaking ideas. He then walks us through a brief discussion of the differences between Right-Wing and Left-Wing Sellarsians, noting that he thinks that this rough distinction in Sellars' heirs reflects a real tension in Sellars' own thought, a tension that, as we shall see in his own contribution to the volume, O'Shea attempts to resolve by melding together naturalistic and Kantian themes in Sellars' thought. Lastly, O'Shea presents helpful summaries of the volume’s essays.

Robert Brandom's "Sellars' Metalinguisitc Expressivist Nominalism" is the only contribution that appears not to be a descendant of a paper given at the conference.[1] Brandom takes on the task of assessing Sellars' metalinguisitc nominalism, as Sellars develops it in three key papers, "Grammar and Existence: a Preface to Ontology," "Abstract Entities" and "Naming and Saying."[2] Brandom gives a positive assessment of Sellars' reworking of Carnap's nominalist metalinguistic account of abstract entities where Sellars makes important use of two of his technical linguistic devices, the dot quote and the notion of distributive singular terms. However, Brandom argues that Sellars has not clearly distinguished his own pragmatic metalinguistic account of abstract language from semantic accounts of language. Consequently, Sellars illegitimately draws semantic and ontological conclusions from pragmatic usage. Brandom argues that such conclusions are merely compatible with their premises, but do not, as Sellars appears to think, follow from them. As a result Sellars' nominalist semantic conclusions and the nominalist ontological conclusions he draws from them are not firmly established. Brandom then invites us to read his book (2015), where he examines in detail the complex relationships of semantic and pragmatic meta-languages. Last, he examines Sellars' use of the language of Jumblese to motivate nominalism. Here too, Brandom finds Sellars drawing controversial semantic and ontological conclusions from pragmatic premises. This heir of Sellars concludes that he cannot get all he needs for his pragmatic expressivist project from his intellectual parent.

Robert Kraut's focus in "Norm and Object: How Sellars Saves Metaphysics from the Pragmatist Onslaught" also concerns Sellars' views about abstract entities. But Kraut views Sellars' project from a different perspective than Brandom. While Brandom's own project and his understanding of Sellars downplays ontological commitments, Kraut views Sellars not as a nominalist metaphysician who wants to eliminate abstract entities but as a pragmatist metaphysician whom pragmatists need not avoid. Pragmatists generally deplore metaphysicians appeal to abstract entities. These appeals, they maintain, make normative practices dependent upon abstract entities. Kraut shows that Pragmatists have nothing to fear on that score from Sellars. Making use of Sellars' dot-quote convention, he demonstrates that on Sellars' account abstract entities are best viewed as "shadows" of real world normative practices. Normative practices are a genuine part of the real world; abstract entities are not. Kraut concedes that this account of how to reconcile pragmatism with Sellarsian metaphysics may not satisfy every metaphysician or eliminate every sort of appeal to abstract entities such as, for instance, possible worlds. But, that was not Sellars' aim to begin with. Indeed, Kraut offers a way to understand how even these exemplars of abstract entities are the results of normative practices. Thus, this son of Sellars appears to be much more satisfied with his pragmatic inheritance than is Brandom.

In stark contrast, Rebecca Kukla and Mark Lance find Sellars' supposed pragmatism woefully lacking. To make their case, they focus on Sellars' myth of Jones. To account for verbal behavior and sensory reactions, genius Jones postulates sensation and thought as theoretical entities. Kukla and Lance find this proposal embraces four key claims: "the isomorphism of speech and thought; the essential innerness of thought; the idea that for each speech act, or case of 'overt verbal behavior', there is a distinctive correlative event of thinking; the helpfulness of thinking of thoughts as inner utterances" (82-3). They argue that all of these claims fail to provide an understanding of either speech or thought. For that distinction is not an ontological one concerning either the "geography" of these acts or their epistemic character, but a pragmatic one concerning the essentially public, communicative character of speaking and the essentially private and non- communicative character of thinking. These intellectual descendants want nothing to do with their intellectual forebear. His pragmatism is entirely wanting.

But, things get even worse for Sellars, the supposed pragmatist, when we turn to Michael Williams' "Pragmatism, Sellars, and Truth". Here Sellars' affair with the correspondence theory of truth sinks any attempt to make him out either as a descendant of the classical pragmatists, James, Peirce and Dewey, or the progenitor of contemporary neo-pragmatism and its most prominent representatives, Rorty, Brandom and Huw Price. The latter not only take an anti-representational view about thought, as do the classical pragmatists, but also a linguistic turn, focusing on meaning as use. With that comes a deflationary account of truth whose key element is that truth has no explanatory value. Williams finds Rorty's concerns about Sellars' pragmatism justified because its insistence on the legitimacy of some notion of correspondence truth raises the specter of skepticism -- a totally unnecessary sort of pre-occupation. But, Williams finds that Rorty's concerns are fostered by mistakenly taking seriously Sellars' notions of truth as semantic assertibility and as picturing. What remains tenable in Sellars' account is his inferentialist (functionalist) approach to meaning, that is, meaning as use. Sellars fails to be the progenitor of contemporary pragmatism because he does not embrace its "radical anti-metaphysical" implications. He could have, but tragically, he did not!

According to Williams the problem with Sellars was that he valued truth too much, thus tarnishing his pragmatist credentials. For McDowell, his progenitor did not value it enough. Or to put it more carefully, Sellars' epistemic efforts, much to McDowell's disappointment, do not secure an account of knowledge in terms of which cognizers are able to know that they know. They are unable to attain certainty. McDowell's "A Sellarsian Blind Spot" lays out his argument that Sellars' account of perceptual knowledge allows only probable knowledge. It thus falls foul of skeptical challenges. McDowell seeks to remedy this problem by offering a view of epistemic self-consciousness that, while avoiding the myth of the given, nevertheless ensures that some perceptual attainments are conclusively warranted, thereby ensuring genuine epistemic success.

In "Images, Descriptions, and Pictures: Personhood and the Clash," Willem A. deVries is concerned with how Sellars envisions putting together the truths of the manifest and scientific images of man-in-the world, Sellars' synoptic vision. Supporting Sellars' goal of seeing how things hang together, deVries finds the replacement of the truths of the manifest image by those of the scientific image envisaged by Sellars in his synoptic vision problematic. Sellars argues that the descriptive and explanatory elements of the scientific image will replace those of the manifest image. But this will involve no genuine loss because human agents will be able pursue their intentions informed with a correct view of the way things are. But, on deVries' view, Sellars' view of unification cannot work. DeVries  maintains that the concept of a person, and so of intentional agency, is ineliminable from descriptive discourse and thus, ineliminable from the scientific image and, therefore, ineliminable from any attempt at the union of the manifest and scientific images. This is so because "[a] language that has a semantic dimension but no pragmatics is, literally, useless" (57). Thus, Sellars' "ideal of a pure descriptive core to language shorn of all modal or normative connotations is a pipe dream" (57). However, deVries does not maintain that this shortcoming in Sellars' attempt to see how things hang together leads to the conclusion that the joining of the two images is a futile task since the two images are fundamentally incompatible. Rather, deVries envisages a mutual accommodation between the two images in which as the scientific concepts are put to use in our ethical, aesthetics, and religious practices and deliberations they are themselves enriched and are no longer purely descriptive scientific concepts.

In contrast, with the Left-Wingers attending this family reunion, all of whom find significant deficiencies and errors in their philosophical progenitor, O'Shea ("What to Take Away from Sellars' Kantian Naturalism") finds tensions in Sellars' thought, but in the end, creative solutions, in particular a creative melding of a scientifically based naturalism with a Kantian naturalism. Thus, he presents us with a Middle Sellars that overcomes the dichotomies that characterize Left-Wing and Right-Wing positions. O'Shea distinguishes what he calls Sellars' "quasi-Kantian" claim that the objects of the manifest image are transcendentally ideal from a genuine Kantian naturalism concerning the structure of human knowledge. A main reason why the former is only quasi-Kantian is, of course, that Sellars argues that the Kant's unknowable noumena are to be replaced by the imperceptible entities postulated in the scientific image. Though Sellars' quasi-Kantian view entails that the ontological conception of persons in the manifest image (a roughly Aristotelian/Strawsonian conception) will be replaced by a scientific one, nevertheless, on O'Shea's Middle Sellars account, persons as thinkers and agents "exist univocally across both the manifest and scientific images" (132), thereby ensuring Sellars' synoptic vision. This is so because the latter features of being a person concern normative features that are to be distinguished from factual ones. O'Shea argues that Sellars establishes the ontological continuity of persons as thinkers and agents across frameworks in an a priori way by a conceptual analysis that lays out the necessary conditions for the existence of any such cognitive agents.

O'Shea then goes on to show how this general Kantian naturalistic approach works itself out in the case of perceptual knowledge. Perceptual knowledge requires (1) correct language (conceptual) entry transitions that are (2) normally caused by the right sort of object and (3) mediated (non-epistemically) by non-conceptual sensings. This entails that the perceivings of normal observers in normal circumstances will be reliable. To attain knowledge, such perceivings must be justified and that requires an internalist move such that the perceiver is able to offer a good reason for the reliability of her perceptual judgment. The latter entails an appeal to background knowledge that involves epistemic principles. How are such principles to be justified? Appeals to the given are, of course, ruled out. If so, how are the twin epistemic disasters, infinite regress or circularity, to be avoided? On O'Shea's interpretation, Sellars rejects an inductively-based solution as well as one in terms of natural and social selection. In the end the Middle Sellars settles on an a priori justification. Given that we are successful perceptual knowers in a world not of our own making, a necessary condition for success is the truth of the epistemic principles operative in the justification of perceptual knowledge. I have argued elsewhere (2011, a, b) that O'Shea's interpretation of the central epistemological texts which he discusses misses an evolutionary option to which Sellars appeals and downplays Sellars' insistence that he rejects appeals to Kantian style a priori methods. (See also, O'Shea's (2011) response.)

Now to our Right-Wingers: Ruth Garrett Millikan, David Rosenthal and Johanna Seibt. Let's begin with Millikan's "Confessions of a Renegade Daughter." After enunciating her great debt to Sellars, she confesses to having strayed from her intellectual father in three ways. First, she has deepened Sellars' appeal to a scientifically based account of norms of thought and language founded in the behavioral science of operant conditioning by deepening Sellars' own recognition of their bases in biology. Thus she has shown how intentionality has a foundation in biology and evolutionary theory. How could Sellars be unhappy about this? Second, while Sellars took the norms of intentionality, the understandings of which enabled the attributions of success or failure to be constituted by material and formal rules of inference, as well as input and output rules for outer and inner language, she maintains that these rules are constituted by the activity of picturing and "lay beyond" the norms comprising intentionality. As a consequence they provide a way to understand perceptual activity geared for action and animal cognition. This move involves two departures from her intellectual progenitor. First, it made the case for two sorts of representations, descriptive and directive and, thus, two directions of fit: mind to world and world to mind. Millikan tells us Sellars resisted this move. Why did he? The second part means that public language and the selective forces affecting it can be examined in themselves, independently of an individual speaker's use of that language. Linguistic types are themselves subject to social selection. This move, I think, would find Sellars smiling. The result is a third departure, the abandonment of inferentialism. While Sellars held that the Norms of Language that enable successful communication between speakers and hearers required an agreement in the methods used by speakers and hearers, Millikan argues that it requires only an agreement in judgments. Appealing to Helen Keller as a paradigmatic case of someone able to communicate successfully while using methods quite distinct from her dialogue partners, Millikan argues that the tokens of a language used by a speaker can be learned and successfully used by her to ascertain and re-identify referents and extensions.

How do these "departures" affect her relations with other members of the Sellarsian family? First, picking up on O'Shea's "helpful" suggestion that Sellars' program involves an analytic and an explanatory task, one a priori and the other scientific, Millikan confesses that if O'Shea's suggestion is true, then she has abandoned the analytic task "almost completely." But, she opines that she could try to excuse herself since the alleged necessity of engaging in the analytic task is based on an empirically false assumption about the nature of thought and language. The results of the explanatory task show that the analytic task is not needed. Surprise: this Right-Winger agrees totally! But, then, with what I cannot help thinking is a twinkle in her eye, Millikan tells us "But -- to this audience, I feel like apologizing [emphasis added] -- no inferentialism (at least not at the base). No conceptual necessity; no conceptual analysis; no basic rules of language other than semantical rules of extension; no concepts as nodes in an inference net" (122). Previewing her forthcoming book, she goes on to show how what she calls unicepts provide a basis for her departures, a basis that itself has a home in Sellarsian epistemology and scientific realism. How could Sellars be unhappy!

In "Quality Spaces, Relocation, and Grain," Rosenthal examines Sellars' account of the ontological status of color sensations. Sellars contends that when it comes to the manifest image conception of color sense impressions there is a special problem in uniting them with the scientific image. This is so because the intrinsic nature of color sensings is homogenous while the objects of the scientific image are ultimately particulate. Sellars' complex solution is (1) to argue that the esse of color is sentiri and (2) to postulate as a feature of future neuro-science an appropriate (but yet to be discovered) counterpart. Rosenthal argues that the ontological priority enunciated in (1) is mistaken and that with respect to (2) the scientific image counterpart of colors are the reflectances of physical object. Rosenthal traces Sellars' error to his acceptance of the classical relocation solution to the ontological status of color.

From Galileo on it was argued that the realities appropriate to the scientific image have to be capable of mathematical formulation. Those resistant to such formulation, as it seemed color was, are not part of the physical world revealed by science, so must be mind-dependent realities. To solve the problem of their status in a world whose ontology was dictated by science, they were relocated to the mind. The feature of color that seems to demand this relocation was the ultimate homogeneity of color sensations. Our conscious awareness of color sensings, we think, reveals their intrinsic qualitative character to be homogenous. Sellars accepts this idea and thus the relocation project, but with a twist. Sellars maintains that the homogenous character of color sense impressions has been projected back onto the color properties of physical objects. Thus, when genius Jones introduces our Rylean ancestors to his manifest image theories about inner sensations, built on a theoretically postulated analogy between the projected color of physical objects and color sensations, the homogeneity that has been projected as a property of colored physical objects is relocated in the theoretically postulated sensa.

Rosenthal contends that Sellars' Jonesian story correctly reflects the priority in the order of knowledge of physical color concepts to the concepts of the color qualities of the postulated sensa. However, appealing to the phenomena of successful unconscious sensory perception, he argues that sensory awareness is not necessarily conscious. Though the scientifically based theory of qualitative-space sensory awareness shows that conscious sensory awareness of color reveals color to be homogenous and, thus, confirms introspective (and thus conscious) accounts, that theory does not tell us that its intrinsic character is homogenous since it is based on a comparatively-based identification and characterization of colors, not an absolute one. As a result, we can understand the intrinsic character of the color of physical objects mathematically in terms of reflectances. So conceived, color can be a straightforward feature of the scientific image.

In her challenging "Sensory Conscious and Intentionality," Seibt finds wanting what she calls the "traditional dichotomous interpretation" of Sellars' project that sees it torn between the normative and causal orders. And, in contrast with O'Shea's attempt to unify things through a Kantian naturalistic Middle Sellars, she argues that Sellars' process framework brings a unity to the normative and causal orders by understanding causal and normative processes to be on a continuum. Thus, she places Sellars' account of intentionality and sensory consciousness within a larger process metaphysical framework and shows how it gains support in current cognitive scientific theories that are themselves rooted in dynamic systems theory. In doing so, she illustrates how a naturalistic metaphysics can both find support for its metaphysical theorizing in the sciences, while at the same time, provide heuristic guidance for scientific theorizing, through what she calls projective metaphysics. I came away informed and highly motivated to return to Sellars' process views under the guidance of Seibt's extensive development of those views.

This collection is a fitting tribute to Sellars by some of his most prominent heirs and should be of interest to Sellarsians of any stripe.


Brandom, R. (2015) From Empiricism to Expressivism: Brandom Reads Sellars. Harvard University Press.

Millikan, R. (Forthcoming) Beyond Concepts: Unicepts, Language, and Natural Information Oxford University Press.

O'Shea, J. (2011) "How to be a Kantian and a Naturalist about Human Knowledge: Sellars' Middle Way" Journal of Philosophical Research: 36: 327-59.

Rottschaefer, W. (2011a) "Why Wilfrid Sellars is Right (and Right-Wing): Thinking with O'Shea on Sellars, Norms, and Nature" Journal of Philosophical Research 36: 291-325.

Rottschaefer, W. (2011b) "The Middle Does Not Hold" Why It's Always Better to be Right with the Right-Wing Sellarsians" Journal of Philosophical Research, 36: 361-69.

[1] Brandom's essay is a modified version of chapter seven of his Brandom (2015).

[2] O'Shea provides a list of Sellars' works following the standard citation abbreviation system for them. So the reader can easily track the references to Sellars' works in the essays.