Sellars and the History of Modern Philosophy

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Luca Corti and Antonio M. Nunziante (eds.), Sellars and the History of Modern Philosophy, Routledge, 2018, 285pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138065680.

Reviewed by Johannes Haag, Potsdam University


The editors of this contribution to the recently pleasantly enlivened field of Sellars studies pursue a twofold goal. On the one hand, they aim at illustrating how Sellars in his stance towards the history of philosophy was carefully treading a middle-ground between those who carelessly assimilate historical contributions to our own philosophical problems and those for whom History of Philosophy is simply history of contextualized ideas. On the other hand, they show how Sellars' own philosophy can be viewed as growing out of different philosophical (and scientific) movements and systems of the late-19th century and the first half of the 20th century. Consequently, the volume is structured in two parts, the first concentrating on Sellars' interpretations of prominent philosophers in the early modern period, the second part concerned mainly with influences on Sellars' work.

In the first chapter, Christian Barth gives an extremely studious and well-informed close reading of some of Sellars' central claims about Descartes' theory of ideas. Sellars uses this theory repeatedly for an exposition of core problems of intentionality. Barth applauds Sellars for his careful interpretation, while at the same time taking issue with some of the central aspects of the interpretation. The questions addressed are complex and the distinctions involved are subtle. Barth takes Sellars to be committed to ascribing to Descartes a (albeit only metaphorical) "container"-reading of the relation between act and object/content. From this all kinds of problems follow, as for instance the commitment to two different kinds of conscious awareness of mental states qua, say, volitions and their respective content (in our example: the object of the volition).

The diagnosis is correct, though its consequences might be less dramatic than Barth makes it seem. Sellars, though ultimately sticking to the "container"-reading for the Kant-related purpose at hand, at the same time acknowledges a "recessive trait" (Sellars, Science and Metaphysics (SM) London 1968, 35) that figures most prominently in Descartes's definition of idea in his Appendix to the Second Replies, where he takes Descartes to offer a unified account of ideas and non-ideational representing mental acts by means of their form that "is a descendant of the scholastic term 'species' as applied to mental acts" (SM 35). The species-reading not only allows for the "self-contained acts" conception of non-ideational acts, but also opens the possibility of a non-container view of mental content that is much closer to Barth's own favored presentation-reading of the objective existence of objects in ideas. Accordingly, Sellars' version of Cartesian indirect realism could be given a more charitable reading.

A piece of the theory of intentionality that is, arguably, much closer to a mature theory (as opposed to a mere photo-theory) in Sellars' eyes, is discussed in the excellent contribution of Antonio M. Nunziante. Via a discussion of actuality, Nunziante skillfully links Sellars' reception of Leibniz's treatment of the modalities to the Kantian inner-representational conception of objectivity and truth that Sellars himself defends in a number of places both as an interpretation of Kant and as an important step in the development of a satisfactory theory of intentionality.

Whereas the importance of Descartes and Leibniz for Sellars has often been noticed, the case of Hume is different. David Landy, in his chapter, starts by noting that Sellars often seems to take Hume as a negative foil for the exposition of his own ideas. (He does not mention the important exception to this rule: Sellars' conception of the (causal) modalities that recently has been taken up by Huw Price's expressivist account.) He persuasively argues -- by way of example of Hume's conception of substance -- that nevertheless Sellars' own rejection of the Deductive-Nomological account of scientific explanation in favor of a model-cum-commentary account can serve as a model for understanding Hume's method. This is an interesting and surprising result, although it did not become entirely clear to me that, in Hume's method of explaining "the form of a theoretical posit" (73), it can serve as the "perceptible model" (73) the posit is supposedly modeled after. And maybe that is for the better, since Sellars does not really seem to be committed to the model being perceptible. After all, in what might be the most famous application of explanation-by-model, i.e. the Myth of Jones, the genius Jones takes as his model inner replicas that are not thought of as perceptible.

Although Sellars' reading of Kant is, in some sense, omnipresent in the volume at hand, it is only James R. O'Shea who deals with Kant directly, thereby adding another layer to his ongoing venture into what is probably the most congenial counterpart for Sellars in the history of philosophy. O'Shea's contribution is, however, somewhat more programmatic and less detailed in argument than one might have hoped. In particular, the rejection of what O'Shea takes to be the Sellars-Rosenberg suggestion that Kant held an "analogical conception of things-in-themselves or of our sense impressions" (90) would have deserved an in-depth defense. As a claim about Kant the rejection strikes me as very plausible, but it would take a careful interpretation in particular of chapter 2 of SM (a chapter that O'Shea largely neglects in this text) to be completely convincing as an exposition of Sellars' Kant.

Luca Corti tries to put into historical perspective Sellars' relation to Hegel. He observes that, despite Sellars' largely negative remarks about Hegel, a whole new generation of Analytic Hegelians took as its point of departure salient features of Sellars' philosophy. Corti gives a useful rundown of the various developments that can be traced back to Sellars' conception of concepts as essentially rule-governed and socially determined.

The second part of the volume transitions to the "Beginning of the Contemporary Age". Catherine Legg opens this part with a comparison of Peirce's "Reidian direct realism" and Sellars' critical realism, in particular with respect to their views on non-conceptual content. And she suggests a substantial similarity with respect to this part of their respective theories. While these parts of the chapter are illuminating and helpful, there are some undercurrents that are less convincing. There is, for one, a misunderstanding of the regulative ideal of the scientific image as purely descriptive. (This is echoed in the contribution of Dionysis Christias (266).) Sellars is quite clear (for instance in Sellars, "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man", in: Science, Perception and Reality, London 1963, 39) that, while today's natural sciences might be purely descriptive, this cannot be the final word. Secondly (and relatedly) she does a disservice to both Sellars and John McDowell by insisting on the purely "preconceptual" indexicality of the intuitively given, neglecting the essentially phenomenological, not merely indexical role of Sellars' image-models as synthetic, conceptual unities of non-conceptual content. (McDowell discusses this role in ch. 6 of Having the World in View, Cambridge, Ma. 2009.) Legg's discussion of McDowell's views on Sellars in particular is intertwined with the very interesting Peirce-Sellars theme in a way that strikes me as not differentiated enough to be helpful.

Danielle Macbeth offers a deep analysis of Sellars and Frege on concepts and laws -- with Kant as an important point of triangulation. She, correctly on my view, interprets Sellarsian concepts as Fregean senses. However, at the same time she attributes to both Kant and Sellars a view of intuitions as representations that "without concepts are of no cognitive significance" (151). This is ambiguous: it can either be read as implying that intuitions do not have any conceptual content and their function is restricted to referring to (or the giving of) an object; or it can be understood as saying that intuitions need to be conceptualized (in, say, an act of synthesis) in order to play the role of referring to an object in the first place. While it is extremely controversial to which of the two readings Kant is committed, there can be little doubt as to where Sellars (and his Kant) stand: Sellars consistently and unwaveringly ascribes conceptual structure to intuitions (his "perceptual takings"), albeit not of a propositional kind. Consequently, Sellars could subscribe to Frege's conception of the two distinctions of concept and object on the one hand and sense and significance (Fregean Bedeutung) on the other as being "orthogonal" (152): While he would deny that concept words as opposed to object names do signify, he would certainly not claim that object names qua intuitions/perceptual takings do not have sense. However, this criticism does not affect what is, arguably, the main point of Macbeth's paper: that Frege's philosophical integration of the "second wave" (150) of the scientific revolution provided him with the conceptual means to deliver a new conception of the significance of mathematical language -- and the language of logic. This highly interesting, though controversial, point deserves much closer scrutiny than can be provided in this review.

Sellars' relation to Pragmatism, already touched upon by Legg, is Carl B. Sachs' main focus. Sachs' discussion uses the rather enigmatic Sellarsian concept of picturing in order to achieve greater clarity about this relation. This method seems well chosen since Richard Rorty marked this very concept as the crucial point of alienation between Sellars and Pragmatism. In essence, Sachs points out that Rorty's criticism is misguided since it misunderstands the concept of picturing as an epistemological concept. This analysis, which builds on Jay Rosenberg's interpretation of picturing, strikes me as correct. However, Sachs goes one step further and claims: "Picturing is not a substitute for a God's-eye view, but a speculative anticipation of an empirical theory of human and nonhuman cognition" (167). But that cannot be right: If picturing is indeed a "determinative function of matter-of-factual representational systems" (167; quoting Rosenberg), why, then, should it be restricted to anticipation. Surely there is a need for this function hic et nunc and not merely in an ideal state of science. The beauty of a functional characterization, as Sellars often points out, is exactly that we do not need to determine what in the natural world fulfils this function. Given that this is correct, the basis of the ascription of a function of this kind must, of course, be based on "a priori reasons" (168). (That, I would argue, is why Sellars carefully ties his conception of picturing to his discussion of the transcendental underpinnings of his conception of objectivity in ch. 5 of SM.) Only if we confuse picturing in general with the ultimate ideal picture that serves as a regulative idea can we conceive of picturing itself as an open (scientific) question.

The only chapter focusing on a movement outside philosophy is Peter Olen's impressive and challenging take on Sellars' reception of behaviorism. Olen not only gives a stupendously erudite overview of the different behaviorist influences on Sellars; he furthermore, in the form of a dilemma, confronts Sellarsians with the behavioristic methodology underlying one of the most commonly accepted parts of Sellars' system, i.e. his functional role semantics. I am not quite convinced yet that functional role semantics with its root in behavior is tied to a particular conceptual framework at a point in time, i.e. a framework that, in principle, could be replaced by an explanation that does not even rely on successor concepts for behavioral terminology. However, the challenge posed by Olen's dilemma should be taken seriously.

Carlo Gabbani's chapter on Sellars and Carnap provides another insightful and well-researched analysis of a complicated relationship. Especially in the introductory section, Gabbani relies heavily on unpublished material from the Wilfrid S. Sellars Papers. His and Fabio Gironi's chapter on Sellars' philosophical indebtedness to his father Roy Wood Sellars bear testimony to the wealth of interesting material that in the coming years can be expected to shed new light on many aspects of Sellars scholarship. Gabbani focuses on the treatment of nominalism in Sellars and Carnap. It is interesting to watch Carnap, determined to leave metaphysics behind, resisting Sellars' nominalistic proclivities. The resulting picture shows Sellars as a traditionalist who conceives himself as part of the rich tradition we see him interact with in this volume.

Of the 20th century philosophers it is arguably Wittgenstein who had the greatest influence on Sellars. This influence is investigated in Guido Bonino and Paolo Tripodi's well-argued chapter. They aim at carving out not only the different systematic aspects of Sellars' engagement with the early and the late Wittgenstein, respectively, but in addition the different methodological approaches Sellars chooses in dealing with these aspects. In the case of the later Wittgenstein they see Sellars mainly using his terminology as a means of communication, whereas the early Wittgenstein (in Sellars' somewhat idiosyncratic reading) helps him to solve the philosophical problem of a "linguistic idealism" (227).

I already pointed to Gironi's chapter on Roy Wood Sellars and his Critical Realism. Like Olen, Gironi resurrects a neglected influence on Sellars and makes a very strong case for the importance of this influence. He succeeds by providing the reader with a dense and intricate outline of the development of Critical Realism, a discussion of Roy Wood Sellars' rather special role in this movement, and, finally, an analysis of the concrete influence on his son's philosophical development.

In the concluding chapter, Christias discusses the possible future of Sellars' philosophy. He argues that given that Sellars was indeed committed to the possibility of overthrowing every part of our conception of ourselves-in-the-world, Sellars' own thought could and, indeed, should be transformed and transgressed in order to do justice to the essential historical dimension of philosophical thought. There is, however, reason to doubt that Sellars indeed subscribes to this radical conception of possible conceptual change and, in particular, the historicity of philosophical thought. His take on Kant's categories could be read to leave open the option of an enduring conceptual "scaffolding" that contributes as much to the possibility of talk about successor-images as does the mapping of objects by means of the picturing relation. In other words, if we take seriously the transcendental-philosophical leanings of Sellars we should at least be reluctant to claim that there are "social-historical (and, ultimately, conceptual) limits" (271) with respect to every aspect of his philosophy.

In sum, this volume is a valuable addition to Sellars studies. Corti and Nunziante did an excellent job of choosing the subject and bringing together an interesting group of both philosophically and historically well-versed Sellars scholars. The success of the merging of a historical, even philological, perspective on Sellars with a systematic approach to philosophical questions in particular paid philosophical dividends.

What is missing? Maybe a chapter on Spinoza and certainly a chapter on Berkeley. Furthermore, a complete investigation of the complex and vast subject of Sellars and History of Philosophy, of course, would have to integrate his reading of ancient and medieval philosophy. Consequently, much remains to be done for future research with respect to this intriguing subject. Corti and Nunziante have succeeded in making a very strong case for this kind of research -- and for making us aware that there is a whole new generation of Sellars scholars that is up for its complexities.