Selves and Other Texts: The Case for Cultural Realism

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Margolis, Joseph, Selves and Other Texts: The Case for Cultural Realism, Penn State University Press, 2001, 224pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0271021500.

Reviewed by Robert C. Scharff, University of New Hampshire


It is easy to identify the general thesis of this, the latest of Margolis’ numerous books. It is more difficult to do justice to the sophisticated, often sweepingly polemical and revisionist strategies by means of which he argues his thesis. His book is about “cultural realism,” the view that “culture” – that is, human selves and their creations (e.g., language, history, action, and here especially, art) – is both emergent from, but also “just as real” as (and irreducible to) physical nature. What Margolis means by “real” clearly does not map at all well onto the current realist-antirealist debate, or onto the terrain of analytic epistemology more generally. It is already unorthodox enough to claim that nature and culture are equally real; it is beyond the pale to assert both this and the claim that culture is nevertheless emergent from nature. To orthodox minds, the first claim will seem insufficiently respectful of naturalism; the second, true but therefore contradicting the first claim.

Cultural realism forms part of Margolis’ overall “constructive realism,” according to which (i) a conception of what is [physically or culturally] real is always a theoretical and legitimating “posit” rather than a representation and (ii) the notion that something is real is never a separable issue from this posit but always “symbiotic” with it. The argument is that “however ontically ‘independent’ we suppose the real to be,” it is nevertheless “epistemically dependent on human conditions of understanding and belief.” Thus, according to Margolis, if analytic philosophers were more reflective about their own orientation, they would realize that even a “realist reading of what is real is itself an interpretive posit…subject to the historical drift of our conceptual schemes” (142).

Here also lies the resolution to the apparent antinomy involved in Margolis’ asserting both that culture has equal ontic/epistemic footing with nature and that it is emergent from nature. The antinomy, he says, is “benign.” For the sense in which culture is a posit (and so includes the story of the rise of the sciences of nature) and the sense in which culture is emergent from nature (and thus studied by the sciences) must be understood as co-ordinate, not ranked. In the former sense, “nature” figures in an account of “the order of what is known or is intelligible”; in the latter, it belongs to an account of “the order of what is real.” Margolis’ argument for this distinction is not a knockdown argument; it is historical. It is about time, he says, that we see how disjoining these two orders – or what is just as bad, imagining there is some objectivist or foundationalist third way of really conceiving “the universe” (without posits) that would tip the realist scales in favor of the causal account – this disjoining is perhaps the “deepest error” in all of Western speculation (2). It will not make Margolis many new analytic friends that he likens the objectivism/foundationalism in English-language philosophy to Antonin Scalia’s “textualist” theory of Constitutional interpretation (117-19).

Margolis’ cultural realism is thus an expression of his root-and-branch opposition to the way analytic philosophy – thanks largely to its unfortunate commitments in epistemology and so also in the spin-off philosophies of physical science, language, and mind – “has tended to impoverish itself by a kind of increasing neglect of the leading themes of cultural life” (9). Though he generously depicts himself as reclaiming “the subterranean possibilities of [analytic philosophy’s] own best work,” he insists that this requires jettisoning virtually all its now “canonical doctrines.” Reclamation starts with the recognition that there simply is no epistemic view from nowhere, no de re necessity, no transhistorical and normatively invariant structure of reason. Consequently every characterization of our worldly encounters must be understood as “interpretive” all the way down (i.e., never preceded by “descriptions” that get something antecedently and foundationally right about what’s really out there). It follows, to name a few corollary mistakes especially relevant in Selves, that it is equally wrong to hold that “natural” things are the really real, that “human” phenomena are ontologically suspect or best explained in physicalist and behavioral terms, that “mind” can be adequately interpreted without reference to what it is actually like to think/judge/act, or that “we” have a history in a way that “nature” does not. For each of these assumptions, Selves provides a detailed rebuttal.

In all of this, however, Margolis sees himself not as a solitary voice in the wilderness but as someone consciously promoting a basic transformation of philosophy that is already underway in any case, and that is affecting both the analytic and continental traditions. By training, Margolis comes to this transformative event from the Anglo-American side, but he confesses to having long labored under the “distinct disadvantage of admiring both ‘analytic’ and ‘continental’ work in about equal measures” (xiii). He therefore conceives his task as an attempt to “translate the philosophical achievements of the continental tradition that have been grievously ignored, in the local idiom of the analysts.” And, although he yields to no one in his respect for the “genuine rigor” demanded by analytic philosophy, he warns that its very survival depends upon a “frank rapprochement between Anglo-American and continental European philosophical currents.”

Given this general orientation, Margolis’ division of Selves into two main parts makes good sense, even if its rationale is not directly reflected in the title. Part One presents detailed analyses of four “specimens” of analytic aesthetics. With a nice touch of critical self-understanding, Margolis makes his own previous work the fourth specimen, candidly admitting to earlier shortcomings, but also claiming ultimately greater success in surmounting the usual epistemological and metaphysical presumptions that plague the work of Beardsley, Goodman, and Danto. Taken in this order, Margolis argues, their aesthetic theories mark off a path from narrow to apparently wide deviation from analytic orthodoxy, yet in such a way that they nevertheless continue to render the reality of art, respectively, either impossible to recognize, incurably distorted, or contradictory to any “philosophical” theory that tries to account for it. Margolis’ point is to show how, in spite of these thinker’s best intentions, the whole field of analytic aesthetics remains corrupted. As he puts it, to look at the last 100 years of English-speaking philosophy through the lens of its philosophies of art and history is to see that its proclaimed mission – that is, the “enormous effort” of everyone from Russell and Moore to Quine and Davidson to split philosophy off from traditional thought in general and post-Kantian continental European philosophy in particular – has “succeeded beyond anyone’s wildest dreams” (xiii). And we, he concludes, are the “impoverished beneficiaries” of this success.

In Part Two, in chapters that lay out a post-analytical “metaphysics of interpretation” and a “deviant ontology of artworks,” Margolis presents, in effect, his conception of a recovered and transformed analytic aesthetics. The point is to see that virtually everything analysts usually assume both metaphysically and epistemologically about art is not only problematic in its own right but also wholly unsuited to understanding either artworks or their appreciation. Artworks are not like physical things, or even physical things plus something. They are “intentionally qualified” through and through – which means it is wrong to assume either that they have fixed natures or that the interpretation of any given artwork must converge on a single, uniquely valid characterization. Instead, artworks are inherently “interpretable” texts or utterances, and they not only tolerate but also positively encourage differing, even contradictory interpretations.

This is not to say, however, that no aesthetic interpretations can be deemed objective. Rather, it means that the “objectivity” of our construals of the meaning of cultural objects must be understood as quite different from the objectivity of our claims about physical things taken as physical things. To embrace this view of objectivity, Margolis argues, is not to fall away from some stricter canon of judgment. The idea of such a canon is part of the mythology of the corrupted standard view. One does a little epistemology of (physical) science; one imagines having found the only test of objectivity there is; and one then insist on applying it, alas, as the best one can have in aesthetics, given the weird quasi-reality of artworks. Margolis sees two mistakes here. It is assumed, first, that the standard of objectivity in the sciences is itself timeless and changeless, and second, that objectivity in science is objectivity everywhere. Demythologizing this standard view means giving up both assumptions and realizing that to do so is a philosophical gain, not loss. “There is,” he says, “objectivity enough for all our needs” without playing favorites or holding fast to a single, ahistorical norm. All construals of every kind of entity are a function of a “reconstitution,” under present conditions, of the history of their past construals, and they always occur “within the historicized tolerance” of some sort of actual practice. There is nothing mysterious or reflexively paradoxical here. It is true that in addition to analyzing every sort of interpretive activity, we may come to conceive all our practices together as establishing a global “horizon” or determinate perspective within which we live and breathe. But it does not follow that we can treat this perspective as if it were the explicitly conceivable viewpoint of yet one more activity to be analyzed. We can be “inferentially” aware of occupying such a global perspective, but it is historians who will have license to analyze it. We cannot fix or define it ourselves (150-153).

Margolis’ final chapter clarifies his choice of title and makes plain the overall strategy of the book. Drawing on his previous discussion of aesthetic interpretation, he now extends his arguments into the conclusion that – canonical linguistic usage notwithstanding – human selves should be understood as “self-interpreting texts” (158), that is, as “culturally adept” beings forever producing interpretable utterances that are themselves forever being interpreted. What is last in Margolis’ order of presentation is thus really first in order of philosophical importance. His book is rightfully entitled Selves and other Texts. It begins with a discussion specifically of aesthetics, but its goal is to differentiate our conceptualizations of physical nature and human culture in terms of the idea that we are self-interpreting and other-interpreting “texts.” Retrospectively, we can then also understand that, “derivatively, anything is a text if and when [it is] suitably…modeled on the paradigm of human thought and behavior” (155).

Margolis’ critique of the Anglo-American mainstream is, in my view, both more radical and more constructive than those of other aspiring post-positivists. At this late date, of course, it is difficult to find anyone who has not expressed displeasure about at least some of the so-called canonical beliefs of the analytic tradition. But Margolis knows there is a general (he calls it “objectivist”) outlook to be attacked that supports them all. He knows also that objectivism is a much more complex tangle of assumption and preference than, say, Rorty imagines, and his arguments against this outlook are detailed and nuanced. Moreover, Margolis’ conclusions about the post-analytic future are admirably less negative and polemical, perhaps in part because his use of continental strains of thought is better informed.

Yet in the end, he is probably right that most of his Anglo-American colleagues will want to “postpone” his revolution for as long as possible. Margolis’ respectful references to the “genuine rigor of analytic philosophy” are brief and unelaborated. And his “benign antinomy” only appears to give comfort to the current naturalist obsession with placing everything about us inside the story of our “emergence” from the world that resulted after the Big Bang. In fact, it is difficult to imagine what might be left of the pre-revolutionary analytic notions of rigor and naturalism after Margolis’ transformation. For rejuvenated analytic philosophers will insist that “all questions of referential, predicative, contextual, and interpretive fixity and objectivity depend, finally, on the consensual tolerance of the fluxive practices of the fluxive society in which our discursive powers were first formed and are sustained” (188).

Gauging the reception Selves can expect from continental philosophers is more difficult. On the one hand, virtually every canonical belief Margolis rejects is already on their own hit lists, though some will have trouble understanding how anyone who has read Kant could still be an objectivist. In addition, except among critical theorists like Habermas, Margolis will certainly gain points for cultivating a sense of the historicity of his own critique of the ahistorical pretensions of analytic mainstreamers. On the other hand, many continental philosophers (though perhaps not orthodox Husserlians and, again, critical theorists) are likely to be nervous about Margolis’ benign antinomy. No doubt the dominant Western tradition has always been “cosmological” in the sense that human beings and their creations get conceptually located within some larger Reality, the knowledge of which is then given pride of place. But if, as Margolis has shown so well, it is plain myth to imagine any such knowledge escaping the specific human conditions of its origin, then how does there come to be an “antinomy” at all? The analysis of physical nature and the analysis of ourselves are, he insists, socio-historically determinate and “conceptually inseparable.” Then where does one stand even to conceive the emergence of ourselves and our ability to know from “the cosmos” – in such a way that this conception forms part of neither the story of Being or of knowing? Elsewhere, Margolis calls it a “wager.” Is it instead, perhaps, a mere vestige of the very philosophical inheritance he is otherwise struggling to transform?

At the very least, continental philosophers might object that in a philosophical atmosphere still dominated by precisely the naturalist and objectivist canon Margolis has so thoroughly dissected, one needs a careful analysis of the origins and reasons for defending an antinomy that will appear to most as anything but benign. There is a general issue here that is difficult to state in a way that does not sound unfair. Selves is structured throughout in a recognizably “argumentative” style. Given the book’s main targets and Margolis’ primary heritage, this certainly makes sense. Yet many of his actual arguments are essentially historical (e.g., How many centuries of failure before we give up looking for…?) or phenomenological (e.g., Your theory of what is real contradicts the actual experience of artworks…). These are, of course, familiar forms of “argument” in continental circles. But why would they be appealing even to mainstreamers who are disenchanted with specific items in the canon? Even expanding their list of items seems unlikely to make new types of “argument” more palatable – and perhaps more likely to simply turn disenchantment into an end in itself (as with, e.g., Rorty’s conclusion that we should just stop doing epistemology).

In other words, what would it take for disenchanted analysts to “see” and be “convinced” of Margolis’ positive global claim, largely dependent upon historical and phenomenological “evidence,” that a rejuvenated analytical philosophizing offers the only real solution to the particular deficiencies of their more familiar and comfortable business as usual? What he proposes is not just the abandonment of some beliefs and assumptions in the canon, but also a radical transformation of the basic epistemic and ontological understanding that supports the kind of canon that encourages these beliefs and assumptions. How, to use the old language, can historical and phenomenological arguments be used to “warrant” such a claim? That these arguments will involve “rigor” in some rejuvenated sense is certainly too elusive – and maybe also too traditional – an idea to be of much help. Put in this demanding form, of course, the question is unfair to the author of the single text, Selves. Yet it is a consideration that seems obviously to come next.