Semantic Externalism

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Jesper Kallestrup, Semantic Externalism, Routledge, 2012, 271pp., $35.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415449977.

Reviewed by Laura Schroeter, University of Melbourne


Semantic externalism is often summed up with Hilary Putnam's famous slogan, 'meanings just ain't in the head'. Back in the 1970s the idea that the semantic content of a person's words and thoughts depend essentially on facts about her external environment was a radical thesis. Thanks to the seminal work of Donnellan, Kripke, Putnam, and Burge, however, semantic externalism has become the new orthodoxy. Recent efforts to revive semantic internalism all start from the presumption that their audience will be convinced that externalism is true.

This volume is the first book-length general survey of influential arguments for and against semantic externalism. Other recent monographs have focused on examining whether and how semantic externalism is compatible with privileged access to the contents of one's own thoughts (Brown 2004; Goldberg 2007; Stalnaker 2008; Gertler 2010), or they have sought to defend an internalist account of content against the prevailing externalist orthodoxy (Segal 2000; Farkas 2008; Mendola 2008; Chalmers 2012). Kallestrup's aim, in contrast, is to give an even-handed guide to the general terrain. The book is part of the useful 'New Problems of Philosophy' series edited by José Luis Bermúdez, which provides opinionated guides to key philosophical issues suitable for advanced undergraduate and graduate students seeking to get up to speed on a recent debate. To this end, Kallestrup provides chapter summaries and very helpful guides to further reading at the end of each chapter, as well as a glossary of technical terms at the back of the book.

The book focuses on linguistic meaning and the content of propositional attitudes, explicitly setting aside externalism about the content of sensory states. The exposition hews to a well-focused discussion of influential arguments in the literature, giving careful, fair-minded consideration to both sides of the debate. There are four chapters devoted to laying out the basic contours of the externalist question, while the final three chapters consider three influential lines of objection to semantic externalism.

The first two chapters set out the essential background of the debate over semantic externalism. Chapter one is devoted to making a prima facie case for descriptivism about the meaning of names and natural kind terms. Descriptivism is the traditional internalist view of semantic content, according to which to be competent with the meaning of a term is just to have implicit knowledge of a descriptive criterion that uniquely specifies the referent. Kallestrup motivates descriptivism through a discussion of Frege's puzzle about informative identity claims, intersubstitution principles, and embedding within the content-clause of belief attributions. Our intuition that co-referential expressions are not intersubstitutable within belief contexts is highlighted as the decisive reason to embrace descriptivist semantics. Kallestrup then introduces Kripke's Pierre puzzle as a possible reason for thinking that our intuitions about belief attributions should be taken with a grain of salt. The first chapter concludes with a discussion of the role of sameness of descriptive sense in successful communication as a further reason to accept descriptivism.

Chapter two focuses on direct reference theories of meaning, or 'referentialism', as an alternative to descriptivism. Referentialism is the thesis that the meaning of a name or natural kind term is exhausted by the object or kind picked out. More specifically, referentialism holds that such terms don't contribute descriptive reference-fixing criteria to the truth-conditions of whole sentences, and it denies that competence with such terms requires knowledge of a particular descriptive criterion (35-7). The chapter considers whether Kripke's modal argument provides adequate grounds for rejecting descriptivism in favor of referentialism. After distinguishing direct reference from rigid designation and introducing the modal argument, Kallestrup outlines Dummett's strategy for responding by invoking the notion of wide scope for definite descriptions. This discussion here may be a bit tricky for some students. Next, the notions of semantic deference and rigidification are introduced as further ways a descriptivist might respond to Kripke. The chapter is rounded off with a discussion of how direct reference theorists like Soames and Salmon explain the semantics and pragmatics of belief ascriptions.

Overall, the discussion in these two chapters presupposes some fluency with the basic tools of philosophy of language, but it does a nice job in giving a sense of the overall contours of this debate in a very short space. One issue I would have liked to see more squarely addressed is how exactly the modal argument -- which targets descriptivist accounts of how names affect the truth-conditions of whole sentences -- is related to the question of semantic competence. Kallestrup says:

What the name 'Aristotle' contributes to determining the proposition expressed by the sentence 'Aristotle was a philosopher' is simply the man Aristotle himself.  . . . Consequently, to understand 'Aristotle' is to know of Aristotle that the name 'Aristotle' refers to him. Such knowledge requires that one is appropriately epistemically hooked up with Aristotle, e.g., is acquainted with Aristotle or otherwise stands in some causal-historical relation to him. (36)

But this transition seems too quick. The issue is important because it's not obvious that the modal argument directly supports a distinctively externalist thesis about competence. As Kallestrup himself notes, one could deny that any descriptive criteria affect the truth-conditions of utterances, while still maintaining that speakers must grasp a criterion for identifying the reference of a term to count as competent (37, 53). Indeed, referentialism as a theory about compositional semantics is perfectly compatible with a descriptivist account of semantic competence: Kaplan's story about the meaning of indexical expressions like 'here' and 'I' takes roughly this form, and many contemporary defenders of internalism appeal to an indexical model to explain how meanings are 'in the head' after all. Kallestrup does not, of course, deny this. But my worry is that focusing on the modal argument as crucial to semantic externalism gives a misleading impression of the crux of the debate between internalists and externalists. The real point of disagreement, I take it, is the individuation of representational state types -- whether what's 'in the head' suffices for competence with the same meaning. But the modal argument by itself does not address this question.[1]

The third chapter turns from language to thought. Here the discussion focuses squarely on the key issue of what's required for conceptual competence: does competence with a particular concept supervene on the internal states of the subject? The chapter starts out with a presentation of Putnam's Twin Earth argument: according to our ordinary semantic intuitions, the fact that two individuals are internal duplicates does not guarantee that they co-refer. So if meanings fix reference, Putnam's internal duplicates will not share the same meanings. Five different internalist responses to Putnam's argument are then considered and dismissed as failing to fit with our semantic intuitions. Burge's arthritis argument is then introduced, and Kallestrup explains how this version of the argument extends Putnam's argument in three ways: (i) it moves from linguistic competence to conceptual competence, (ii) it extends the argument from natural kind concepts to virtually any concept, and (iii) it shows that conceptual competence may depend on facts about the subject's social environment as well as her physical environment. Once again, a number of internalist rejoinders are considered and rebutted. In an interesting move, Kallestrup uses Davidson's Swampman thought experiment to pose an internalist challenge to externalist theories of content, which parallels Putnam's and Burge's externalist arguments. Swampman is an intrinsic duplicate of Donald Davidson who was created through a quantum accident just a few moments ago. Do the two share the same meanings and concepts? Not according to externalist theories (such as Davidson's interpretivism, Devitt's causal theory of names, or Millikan's teleosemantics) that take the history of a state to be essential to determining conceptual content. Kallestrup then considers three rejoinders on behalf of such externalists.

This chapter provides a very useful guide to the famous thought-experiment arguments, showing how our prima face semantic intuitions seem to favor semantic externalism over internalist accounts. However, it would have been nice to have some discussion of the broader philosophical motivations behind the externalist position. Both Putnam and Burge emphasize that our externalist semantic intuitions are backed by deeper theoretical commitments. Our commitment to the mind-independent nature of the objects, kinds and properties we think about, they suggest, commits us to our empirical fallibility about how exactly to define them (Putnam 1970, 1972, 1973; Burge 1986). And our commitment to the stability of meaning through open-ended inquiry and debate seems to rule out requiring that all competent subjects settle on a specific reference-fixing criterion in advance (Burge 1986, 1993). If these claims are right, then semantic externalism is not simply a matter of saving our commonsense semantic intuitions: externalism is bound up with larger philosophical questions about metaphysics, epistemology, and epistemic coordination. Getting a clearer view of these underlying commitments and the extent to which they favor semantic externalism would have helped to better understand the broader philosophical significance of the debate over semantic externalism.

Chapter four, "Varieties of Narrow and Wide Content", surveys a range of different ways of individuating conceptual contents with an eye to the subject's substantive criteria for identifying the reference. The dialectic of the chapter is quite subtle and it is easy to get the feeling of a simple survey of different positions. But this core chapter is where Kallestrup advocates an externalist position in his own voice.

The chapter starts with a discussion of Evans' and McDowell's theory of object-dependent Fregean senses: when there is no object satisfying the subject's reference-fixing criterion, they claim, there is no conceptual content -- just an illusion of content. So on this account, the very existence of a concept depends on the existence of a referent. Kallestrup extends this account to natural kind concepts, and considers Boghossian's 'Dry Earth' argument as an objection to that proposal. He then uses this discussion to distinguish between 'weak' semantic externalism, which holds that precisely which concepts one's mental states express depends on external factors, and 'strong' semantic externalism, which says that whether one's mental states express any concepts at all depends on external factors. Only the weaker thesis, Kallestrup notes, is directly supported by the Twin Earth arguments (98-9).

The chapter then goes on in §4.2 and §4.3 to sketch different ways of characterizing 'narrow' thought content: egocentric rigidified definite descriptions (Lewis, Jackson) and two-factor theories of content (McGinn's cognitive roles and Chalmers' epistemic intensions). In §4.4, Kallestrup points out that all versions of narrow content that purport to fix truth-conditions rely on some notion of indexicality. He then endorses Burge's argument against construing natural kind terms (and the concepts they express) as indexical: whereas indexicals like 'here' shift their reference in different contexts, natural kind terms like 'water' do not. Kallestrup concludes that indexical accounts of narrow content cannot capture the meaning of such terms: at best they explain how their reference was originally fixed, not what speakers must currently accept to count as competent (114-5). But can a referentialist do better in explaining the meaning (and concept) expressed by 'water'? Kallestrup argues that we can capture the meaning of 'water' by taking it to refer to a property or kind (H2O), rather than to an extension (the set of all actual samples of H2O). Some externalists will find this answer unsatisfying because they take concepts to be fine-grained representational states: the concepts expressed by 'furze' and 'gorse' are distinct even though they pick out the very same kind. By ignoring this option, Kallestrup seems to take a position on the proper form of semantic externalism: externalist concepts, it seems, are individuated solely with an eye to their reference.

However, the issue of fine-grained externalist concepts is implicitly addressed in the concluding section, §4.6. Here, Kallestrup takes a step back to consider the nature of mental content: how could external facts be relevant to individuating internal mental states? Kallestrup cites Davidson's sunburn analogy and quotes Stalnaker on the essentially relational nature of representation to motivate the externalist position. The key challenge for the internalist, he argues, is to show that representational relations can be captured by purely intrinsic facts about the subject. To illustrate why this cannot be done, Kallestrup introduces a three-way distinction between purely intrinsic properties (being square), dispositional properties that supervene on intrinsic structure (being water-soluble), and relational properties that fail to supervene on intrinsic structure (being a footprint). Kallestrup argues that wide (referentialist) content is a relational property (like being a footprint), while narrow content is a dispositional property (like being water-soluble). But even 'narrow' dispositional properties, he claims, do not supervene on purely intrinsic states of the subject -- for they depend on the laws of nature and social facts about linguistic use (122). I would have welcomed a more expansive explanation and illustration of the general picture Kallestrup is advocating here -- even at the expense of sacrificing some of the earlier detail of the chapter. Reading between the lines, it seems that he is sympathetic to a two-factor account of content where even the 'narrow' aspect of content is individuated in part by external facts.

The final three chapters of the book focus on three influential lines of objection to the externalist picture. Chapter five considers whether semantic externalism is compatible with privileged knowledge of the contents of one's own thoughts. Chapter six focuses on the claim that semantic externalism will implausibly attribute a priori knowledge of facts about one's external environment. And Chapter seven takes up the question whether externally individuated concepts can figure in causal explanations of behavior. These discussions give the reader a sense of the contours of the contemporary literature through a systematic engagement with the details of the arguments on both sides.

Unlike some books in this series, my sense is that this volume may be rather hard going for students without a background in philosophy of language. The book is densely written and digs into the details of the debates, offering nested series of arguments, objections and replies. So without some external guidance, it may be hard for newcomers to see the forest for the trees. Indeed, on a couple occasions I found it difficult to track the dialectic -- to see whether a point was being advanced on behalf of an objection or a reply. The initial chapters make use of quite a lot of semantic terminology ('meaning', 'proposition', 'concept', 'semantic value', 'reference', 'referent', 'extension', 'informational content', 'representational content', 'cognitive difference', 'cognitive significance', 'synonymy', 'mode of presentation', 'way of thinking'), and although the terms are usually briefly explained in the text, it's not always obvious how the different notions relate to each other; and these basic terms don't figure in the glossary. Often it would have been helpful to have more of a wide-scope overview of the positions and their motivations before plunging into the nitty-gritty of the debates.

On a more substantive level, I thought it would have been helpful to have a section devoted to surveying different positive externalist theories of content: e.g., causal/historical theories, nomic theories, teleosemantics, interpretivism, and Fregean object-dependent senses. Only the last approach receives sustained discussion in the text -- though the other accounts surface implicitly in responses to objections. But there are significantly different motivations and theoretical commitments behind these different externalist approaches. Having the different views explicitly on the table would make it clearer how different externalist conceptions of content have important consequences for how one should address the challenges raised for externalism, such as the viability of narrow content, the role of content attributions in causal explanation, and the nature of self-knowledge.

I've focused in this review mainly on points of disagreement in form and substance. But there will always be quibbles about how best to expound a complex topic like this one. Overall, Kallestrup's book provides an admirably detailed and theoretically engaged guide to the state of the debate on semantic externalism. A seminar devoted to working through the book along with the excellent bibliographical suggestions would put graduate students or advanced undergraduates in a position to understand the broad sweep of this important philosophical discussion.


Brown, Jessica. 2004. Anti-Individualism and Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Burge, Tyler. 1986. Intellectual Norms and Foundations of Mind. Journal of Philosophy 83:697-720.

Burge, Tyler. 1993. Concepts, Definitions, and Meaning. Metaphilosophy 24:649-65.

Chalmers, David. 2012. Constructing the World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Farkas, Katalin. 2008. The Subject's Point of View. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Gertler, Brie. 2010. Self-Knowledge. Abingdon: Routledge.

Goldberg. 2007. Anti-Individualism: Mind and Language, Knowledge and Justification, Cambridge Studies in Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Mendola, Joseph. 2008. Anti-Externalism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Putnam, Hilary. 1970. Is Semantics Possible? In Languages, Belief and Metaphysics, edited by H. Kiefer and M. Munitz. New York: SUNY Press.

Putnam, Hilary . 1972. The Meaning of 'Meaning'. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 7:131-193.

Putnam, Hilary. 1973. Explanation and Reference. In Conceptual Change, edited by G. Pearce and P. Maynard: Dordrecht-Reidel.

Segal, Gabriel. 2000. A Slim Book about Narrow Content. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Stalnaker, Robert. 2008. Our Knowledge of the Internal World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] This issue I raise here is partly obscured because Kallestrup takes 'meanings' to be theoretical entities with two distinct aspects: (i) meanings are abstract entities that contribute to the truth-conditions of whole sentences, and (ii) they are associated with specific (more or less stringent) competence conditions. Referentialists like Soames and Salmon take the contribution of a name or natural kind term to truth-conditions to be simply the referent (an object or kind), and they take competence with the meaning to require nothing more than having some or other way of establishing reference to the same referent. Their positive view thus includes commitments about both compositional semantics and competence conditions. My point is that Kripke's modal argument only supports the first aspect of their view. But it's the second aspect, I believe, that makes their position a distinctively externalist one. Even a traditional Fregean would deny that meanings are 'in the head', if that's interpreted as a claim about the first aspect of meaning: Fregean senses are not individuated by a person's internal cognitive states, since senses are abstract entities whose intrinsic nature does not depend on the mind. The real point of contention between internalists and externalists is about what's required for competence with a given meaning: internalists (including the traditional Fregeans) think the representational state of being competent with a given sense depends exclusively on what's 'in the head', whereas externalists disagree. In contrast, the distinctive point of disagreement between the Fregean descriptivist and the referentialist is about how names and natural kind terms contribute to the truth-conditions of whole sentences. That's not to say that there aren't reasons for moving from referentialism about compositional semantics to externalism about competence conditions. But I would have preferred if these two issues were more clearly separated in the text.