Semantic Singularities: Paradoxes of Reference, Predication, and Truth

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Keith Simmons, Semantic Singularities: Paradoxes of Reference, Predication, and Truth, Oxford University Press, 2018, 249pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198791546.

Reviewed by Roy T. Cook, University of Minnesota, Twin Cities


Keith Simmons' book continues his development and defense of a contextualist solution to the semantic paradoxes, one begun inhis earlier monograph Universality and the Liar (1993). According to (this more recent version of) Simmons' account, we avoid the Liar paradox (and a wealth of other semantic puzzles involving truth, denotation, and predicate extension) by noting that the extension of the truth predicate is context-dependent, and hence, as we reason about the Liar, this context shifts in various ways, resulting in the extension of the truth predicate shifting likewise.

For the sake of simplicity, I am going to restrict my summary and comments mostly to Simmons' treatment of the Liar and related constructions involving truth and falsity. Applications of the singularity account to paradoxes of denotation, predicate extension, etc., proceed similarly (and are susceptible to similar worries).

Simmons motivates the singularity view via having us attend to the following (rational reconstruction of an) intuitive argument about the status of the Liar sentence:

Suppose now that I inadvertently produce a Liar sentence L on the board in room 213:

(L) The sentence written on the board in room 213 is not true.

Since you know where the sentence is written, you can reason in the familiar way that L is a Liar sentence, and semantically defective. But if L is defective, then whatever its status, it is not a truth. So you infer:

(L*) The sentence written on the board in room 213 is not true.

This is a repetition of (L). At the final stage of the repetition discourse, you explicitly declare L* to be true. Now, since L* is true, and it says the same thing as (L), it follows that (L) is true too: (L) is rehabilitated. And with rehabilitation comes iteration: if (L) is true, then what it says is the case, so it isn't true; but then if it isn't true, then since that is what it says, it is true, and so on. (34)

Simmons analyzes this sort of reasoning in terms of four stages, which are worth working through in some detail.

I will concentrate on the simple version of the Liar sentence (based on the discussion of the Liar on pages 34-36) without the distracting details about classrooms and blackboards. Consider an occurrence of:

(L) L is not true.

Initially, we evaluate (L) within a context where truth is assessed in terms of the context in which this initial token of the sentence type in question is produced -- hence, where both the extension of "true" used in evaluating (L) and the occurrence of "true" within that very sentence are evaluated relative to the same context (we'll call this context cL). Hence, our reasoning is governed according to the following evaluative schema ("s" here and below is a name of "S", subscripts indicate the context; I have modified Simmons notation slightly):

s is trueL if and only if S.

Since the L-instance of this is:

L is trueL if and only L is not trueL.

we reason to a contradiction in the familiar (classical) way. Thus, we conclude that L is pathological -- it does not receive a truth-value in its context of utterance, and hence is not trueL (nor is it falseL).

We now move to the second step of the reasoning -- repetition -- where we consider a second token L* of the same type as L:

L*: L is not true.

The argument just given amounts, in essence, to a proof of L*. So L* must be true. But, since L and L* are tokens of the same sentence type, L* cannot be trueL (for the same reasons that L cannot). Thus, L* is true according to a new context of assessment cΣ (the context within which L* was produced) where:

s is trueΣ if and only if S.

This schema, when applied to L*, provides:

L* is trueΣ if and only if L is not trueL.

Since we already proved the right-hand side of this, we conclude that:

L* is trueΣ..

Hence, in context cΣ, L is not trueL.

Finally, we perform the rehabilitation step. This involves another new context -- a reflective context cR governed by the following schema:

s is trueR if and only if S.

Hence, we assess L via the following instance:

L is trueR if and only if L is not trueL.

Since we already, in the repetition step, demonstrated that L is not trueL, we conclude that:

L is trueR.

The final, iteration step occurs via noting that the final biconditional given above goes both ways, and we can "flip" back and forth between "L is trueR" and "L is not trueL" ad infinitum.

One of the most striking things about this account is the central role that (supposedly) intuitive reasoning patterns play in its development and defense. Simmons' primary motivation for the semantic singularities view is that we need this view -- or a view relevantly like it -- to explain the correctness of this sort of back-and-forth, it-has-a-truth-value-then-it-doesn't reasoning. But he gives little argument for the claim that this sort of reasoning is correct, and hence needs to be accounted for. The following passage, which occurs just after he has reconstructed a number of evaluation-repetition-rehabilitation-iteration arguments along the lines sketched above, is typical:

Each of these paradoxical discourses establishes that an expression is paradoxical -- but they go further. The defectiveness or pathology of the expression becomes a new premise in the reasoning: we reason past pathology . . . There is nothing technical or recherché about the paradox-producing reasoning -- ordinary speakers with the notions of denotation, extension, and truth in their repertoire can easily follow it, and readily appreciate the challenge that the paradoxes present. Accordingly, any adequate solution to these paradoxes must respect the naturalness of the reasoning, and provide an account of these discourses in their entirety. (2)

Of course, Simmons is right that any account of the paradoxes must have some explanation of why this sort of reasoning seems correct at first glance, but he gives us no explicit reasons for thinking that the right way to do so is to conclude that these intuitive argument patterns really are correct (except, perhaps, indirectly, via the elegance and wide range of his account, which is, of course, not nothing). As we'll see, however, the semantic singularities view fails to capture some intuitive reasoning patterns of a sort similar to the informal argument quoted above.

First, the requisite summary of contents: Simmons' development and defense of the singularities approach to paradox proceeds as follows. After a brief introduction to the basic ideas in Chapter 1, Simmons presents an informal version of the singularity view in Chapters 2 and 3, based on the idea -- originally due to Gödel -- that paradoxical (and otherwise problematic, see below) constructions such as the Liar are singularities of the semantic notions in question insofar as they, and only they, activate the evaluation-repetition-rehabilitation-iteration pattern sketched above. After motivating the view informally, and working through far more examples than are necessary, Simmons moves on to the formal theory underlying the account in Chapter 4 and 6 (Chapter 5, which feels like something of a digression, contains a number of additional examples and an insightful discussion of the difference between semantic and mathematical versions of the Russell paradox). Chapter 7 then applies the formal theory to even more paradoxes, including the Yablo paradox, the Open Pair, and various novel constructions. Chapter 8 and 9 provide criticisms of other supposedly revenge-free accounts of paradox (the work of Hartry Field and Graham Priest figure prominently), and an argument that the singularity account is genuinely revenge-free, respectively. Finally, in Chapter 10 Simmons argues that the singularity theory is incompatible with deflationism about truth.

The book as a whole is deep, rich, and interesting, but there are (of course) worries. I'll discuss a few of those worries here. Doing so requires delving a bit into the formal machinery presented in the middle chapters.

In the more formal presentation of the view begun in Chapter 4, sentences tokens (such as L above) are represented (51-55), via triples of the form:

<type(ρ), cρ, δ>

where ρ is a sentence token (hence type(ρ) is the sentence type of which ρ is a token), cρ represents the context in which ρ is produced (which determines the context-indexed schema which is to be deployed when evaluating occurrences of semantic vocabulary -- e.g., "true" that occur within ρ), and δ represents the context within which the status of ρ is being assessed (i.e., δ determines the context-indexed schema which is to be deployed when evaluating ρ itself). The primary representation of a sentence token is always of the form:

<type(ρ), cρ, cρ>

Thus, the primary representation of the Liar sentence token L discussed above is:

<type(L), cL, cL>

As we have seen, however, we can assess sentence tokens outside of the initial context in which they were produced (Simmons calls triples representing such evaluations secondary representations). Thus, the Liar token L, assessed from a reflective context -- that is, the Liar as it is evaluated within the rehabilitation step -- is represented as:

<type(L), cL, cR>

Simmons then constructs trees that represent the dependencies that hold between these representations, where one primary or secondary representation is related to another (not necessarily distinct) representation if the sentence token of the former refers to the sentence token of the latter (with context values fixed appropriately) -- or, in Simmons' terminology, if the former sentence token has the latter as one of its determinants (52-55).

A tree with the primary representation of a sentence token ρ as its root is a primary tree. And a sentence token ρ is pathological if its primary tree contains an infinite branch where either some representation of ρ repeats, or no representation repeats, and a sentence token τ is a singularity if and only if:

<type(τ), cτ, δ>

occurs somewhere on an infinite branch of ρ's primary tree (61).

Simmons then provides the following principles governing the context-sensitivity of truth (similar principles are, of course, also provided for denotation and extension):

  1. If s is not a singularity of trueα, then s is trueα iff S.
  2. If s is a singularity of trueα, then s is not trueα (or falseα).

The formal machinery gets a good bit more complicated than this, but these initial details are enough for the comments that follow.

The first thing to notice is that Simmons' formal account amounts to a complex graph-theoretical analysis of these primary trees (and later "pruned" trees and other further, more complicated constructions). Given this, it is surprising -- and as we shall see, unfortunate -- that he completely fails to engage with the growing literature on graph-theoretical analyses of paradoxicality and pathologicality (highlights include: Gaifman 1993; Cook 2003; Rabern, Rabern and Macauley 2013; Beringer and Schindler 2017; Walicki 2017). As a result, much of the formal work mobilized in the more technical chapters feels a bit like a re-invention of (a somewhat simple version of) this particular theoretical wheel: Simmons' development of this material would have benefited greatly from engaging with and applying the sophisticated results found in this literature. At the very minimum, employing that literature's technical vocabulary would have made it much easier to assess the connections between Simmons' approach and the pre-existing literature on graphs and paradoxes.

The next thing to note is that Simmons' account entails that any pathological sentence token ρ (which in the end, amounts on the singularity approach to any sentence token ρ that is ungrounded in roughly Kripke's sense of the term) will be assessed reflectively within contexts corresponding to utterances that do not have ρ in the transitive closure of the determinant relation. Simmons sums up this minimality requirement informally as follows:

Minimality: The application of these expressions is to be restricted only when there is reason to do so. (38)

Hence, in a context cPan where I have just uttered a token that has nothing to do with truth -- "Pancakes are good.", perhaps -- the Liar sentence L turns out to be truePan (since cPan is assumed to be reflective with respect to any sentence that is not of immediate concern, and contexts reflective with respect to L will judge L to be true, since L is neither trueL nor falseL in its original context cL). The principle of minimality seems to cause problems, however. Consider the Open Pair:

(A) B is not true.

(B) A is not true.

Simmons considers the Open Pair towards the end of Chapter 7, and notes that:

A and B are both true when reflectively evaluated. We might have the intuition that if one is true, then the other is not true -- that they must have opposite values. But this intuition is also accommodated: A is true on reflection just because B is not trueB, and B is true on reflection just because A is not trueA. (131, notation modified slightly)

But does this actually accommodate the intuition? This result certainly seems to violate the spirit, even if not the letter, of Minimality: On Simmons' account, these two sentences, which are consistent with each other, and which seem to entail:

A ≡ ←B

nevertheless receive the same truth value in any context in which they receive truth values at all. This seems, intuitively at least, to be somewhat at odds with Simmons' initial motivation for the Minimality:

If an individual has the property ascribed by a predicate Φ, then that individual is in the extension of Φ. The more restrictions we place on our occurrences of our semantic expressions, the more we are at odds with this intuition. We do expect any solution to a genuine paradox to require some revision of our intuitions. But the more a solution conflicts with our intuitions, the less plausible the solution will be. (38)

Perhaps this case can be set aside as one of the unavoidable revisions of intuition. But things turn out even worse with some examples that Simmons does not consider. Take the following instance of the Tautology Teller:

(TT)     This sentence is either true or false.

and the following instance of the Contradiction-Teller:

(CT)    This sentence is neither true nor false.

Presumably, any approach motivated by the desire to mutilate our intuitive conception of truth as little as possible would, all else being equal, prefer an account where TT comes out true, and CT comes out false. After all, one can easily prove the truth of TT, and the falsity of CT, using nothing but the sentences themselves and the corresponding instances of the T-schema (and classical logic). But both of these sentences, like the two sentence tokens in the Open Pair, have loops in their primary trees. Thus, they are both pathological, and thus they are singularities for trueTT and trueCT respectively. Thus, TT fails to be trueTT (and fails to be falseTT), and CT likewise fails to be trueCT and fails to be falseCT.

Now, consider what happens to TT and CT when we move to a reflective context. In any context R which is reflective with respect to both TT and CT (which, recall, includes any context where the sentence token whose production determines the context does not involve either TT or CT), TT turns out falseR (since TT is neither trueTT nor falseTT), and CT turns out to be trueR (since it is neither trueCT nor falseCT). These are exactly the opposite values that intuition assigns to these sentences!

Clearly something has gone wrong. One way to diagnose the problem is the following thought: if something like minimal mutilation is truly the guiding principle behind the singularity view, then the view requires a much more nuanced analysis of which sentence tokens are and are not pathological or singularities. In particular, the analysis of primary and secondary trees will need to distinguish between trees -- such as the tree corresponding to the Liar -- that produce genuine pathologicality, and trees -- such as those corresponding to the Tautology-Teller and Contradiction-Teller -- that are ungrounded, contain loops, etc., but which nevertheless correspond to sentences that are not singularities on this (imagined) version of the view. This kind of graph-theoretic analysis of trees will be a good bit more complicated than the formal material contained in Simmons' book. But, fortunately, much of the work has already been done: One of the primary tasks of the literature on graphs and paradoxes is to distinguish between those graphs that correspond to patterns of reference that cause paradox and those graphs (including graphs with cycles and infinite descending chains) that do not (see Gaifman 1993; Cook 2003;Rabern,Rabern and Macauley 2013; Beringer and Schindler 2017; Walicki 2017). Thus, Simmons' failure to engage with this work is a missed opportunity, one that results in a view that does not seem to live up to the informal desiderata that is the primary motivation for the view in the first place.

Simmons' is an interesting book, containing much that will be of interest to readers interested in the paradoxes in general, and contextual solutions to paradoxes in particular. But in the end, the account Simmons develops does not seem to meet the criteria for success that he lays out at the beginning of the project -- criteria that could have been met had he not failed to engage with the literature graphs and paradoxes.


Beringer, Timon and Thomas Schindler (2017), "A Graph Theoretic Analysis of the Semantic Paradoxes", Bulletin of Symbolic Logic 23(4): 442-492.

Cook, Roy (2003), "Patterns of Paradox", Journal of Symbolic Logic 69(3): 767-774.

Gaifman, Haim (1992), "Pointers to Truth"Journal of Philosophy 89: 223-26.

Rabern, Landon, Brian Rabern, and Matthew Macauley (2013), "Dangerous Reference Graphs and Semantic Paradoxes", Journal of Philosophical Logic 42: 727-765.

Simmons, Keith (1993), Universality and the Liar: An Essay on Truth and the Diagonal Argument, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.

Walicki, Michal (2017), "Resolving Infinitary Paradoxes", Journal of Symbolic Logic 82(2): 709-723.