Semantics and Pragmatics: Drawing a Line

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Ilse Depraetere and Raphael Salkie (eds.), Semantics and Pragmatics: Drawing a Line, Springer, 2017, 357pp, $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319322452.

Reviewed by Kepa Korta, University of the Basque Country


The relation -- the boundaries, the interface, the line, . . . -- between semantics and pragmatics has been a matter of debate from the very origin of the disciplines, and especially from the blossoming of pragmatics after the work of Paul Grice.

Both disciplines claim meaning as their subject matter, so it is natural that they enter into disputes on their territorial boundaries, or, if you prefer, about the distribution of competences over the territory they share. It is a revealing fact that most -- perhaps all -- introductory books to pragmatics start with a contrast with semantics, as if there was no other way to characterize the discipline. This is not the case with introductions to semantics. But this is probably just the result of their different historical origins: at the beginning there was semantics, then came pragmatics.

Be that as it may, in recent decades, the debate exploded with a series of books and papers dealing with the semantics/pragmatics interface, as it was often put (e.g. Turner 1999), or, more particularly, the quantity, if any, and quality of pragmatic encroachment into semantics (e.g. Preyer and Peter 2007). Various fronts were organized in defense of semantics from the assault by pragmatics, and vice versa (see, for instance, Borg 2004, Recanati 2004, Cappelen and Lepore 2005, and Korta and Perry 2011).

The title and subtitle of the present book announce another take on the same issue, at a time when the very attempt to clarify the nature of their relation has been considered a chimera. Some authors think that the distinction is difficult and/or unimportant and confess that "I simply lost my confidence in my ability to see that semantics-pragmatics line, or even to know quite what it was I was looking for" (Dever 2013: 105); others go further and take it as a futile attempt at looking for a distinction where there is none: "there's no such thing as the semantics-pragmatics distinction and looking for it is a waste of time" (Cappellen 2007: 3).

If one expects from this book a renewed and explicit defense of the line between semantic and pragmatics, however, they might be disappointed. Contrary to what the title and subtitle of the book, and the titles of two of its three parts (I. Drawing a Line; II. Crossing Borders; III. Exploring New Territory) suggest, the chapters do not explicitly attempt to draw such a line or to discuss its interface. They all implicitly assume that there is such a line somewhere, though, and, thus, they all implicitly defend some semantic/pragmatic distinction. Using terms that are discussed in some of the chapters, we can say that the volume is not about, but concerns, the semantics/pragmatics line.

The views of semantics and pragmatics assumed by the essays are far from homogeneous. Concerning semantics, the perspectives go from cognitive grammar to construction grammar and formal (possible-world) semantics. With respect to pragmatics, Relevance Theory is the predominant approach, but we can also find philosophical, game-theoretical, linguistic, experimental and clinical perspectives.

In what follows, first, I briefly describe the contents of the volume and then discuss a bit more extensively a couple of issues concerning primary pragmatic processes. One is about the notions of saturation and free pragmatic enrichment; the other is about unarticulated constituents, and the levels of content to which these processes and elements contribute. These are issues that are explicitly dealt with in at least four of the papers, but they are implicitly present in almost all of them when they treat pragmatics. In general, the essays are not concerned with secondary pragmatic processes dealing with conversational implicatures, but with primary pragmatic processes contributing to what is said by a speaker in uttering a sentence. Or, as we can put it following Korta and Perry (2006, 2011), when it comes to pragmatics, the chapters deal with pragmatics at the near-side and not the far-side of what is said. This is not surprising, given that we are in the semantics-pragmatics border territory.

The book is long (19 chapters, including the introduction, plus an index; 357 pages in total). The editorial work is very good; although the index is a bit short, and, perhaps, instead of a separate list of references for each chapter, a final, general list would have been better. With the exception of the Introduction and Chapters 16 to 19, the volume comes in pairs of target paper/response, which helps to nail down insights and arguments that may have been lost otherwise. There is no typo or errata worth mentioning, except one funny citation that reads "Dan and Deirdre 1986" (p. 159) and its corresponding bibliographical entry: "Dan, S., and Deirdre, W. (1986)" (p. 161), instead of "Sperber, D.  D. Wilson (1986)."

In Chapter 2 the editors, Ilse Depraetere and Raphael Salkie, discuss the notions of saturation and free pragmatic enrichment -- which they take to be identical to Kent Bach's notions of completion and expansion -- comparing them to the notions of lexical ambiguity and underspecification. Roughly, they contend that saturation and disambiguation belong to semantics, while enrichment and expansion belong to pragmatics. They illustrate their point with interesting but sketchy applications to the study of modal particles and the present perfect tense.

Chapter 3 responds to Chapter 2, and is a good example of the benefits of having a response paper, especially if it is written by the author of one of the main distinctions appealed to in the target paper. Kent Bach doesn't share Depraetere and Salkie's assimilation of saturation and disambiguation to completion, and he has also a different view on enrichment. I say a bit more about these issues below. Let me now point to another positive feature of the entire volume which is reflected in these two papers: the collaborative discussion among linguists and philosophers, and the combination of conceptual argument and empirical evidence on matters semantic and pragmatic. That's one of the main virtues of the volume.

Part II starts with a paper by the philosopher Siobhan Chapman. She takes us back to the Gricean roots of contemporary pragmatics -- Grice's original program and Saul's defense of it, but also neo-Gricean theories, Relevance Theory and minimalism and contextualism about what is said -- and discusses the role of psychological plausibility and, in particular, the recent developments in experimental pragmatics as a measure of assessing pragmatic theories. Following Clark and Bargenter (2007), she advocates for a collaborative view of pragmatics with "armchair, lab and field" methodologies. Anton Benz responds, expressing his general agreement that experiments cannot be the sole criterion to evaluate pragmatic theories. He then presents game-theoretical pragmatics as a way to deal with the rationality dimension of communication indicated by Grice.

Alison Hall defends a relevance-theoretic view of lexical meaning against the minimalist objections presented, especially by Emma Borg. She concludes that it might well be the case that lexical meanings are not full-blown concepts, that they are devoid of content proper. Thus, all concepts would be "ad hoc", in the sense that they would all be constructed, i.e., modulated starting from a "concept schema."

Maarten Lemmens disagrees. He defends a cognitive, usage-based grammar in which words' meanings would be constituted by a "schematic network of related meanings that themselves are each time a schematization over different contexts of use" (p. 109). These two authors' main differences seem to stem from the differences in their general frameworks: relevance theory versus cognitive grammar.

Bert Cappelle discusses construction grammar, which, according to him, has scarcely dealt with pragmatic phenomena. The paper offers a quite detailed survey of the little that has been done, to argue that pragmatic information should be integrated within the information about the construction, distinguished from semantic information. Frank Liedtke's response argues against the "Saussurean" conception of Cappelle's construction grammar and sketches an idea of pragmatic template of an allegedly more Wittgensteinian inspiration.

Susan Foster-Cohen and Tze Peng Wong present a relevance-theoretic approach to clinical pragmatics.They introduce studies about semantic-pragmatic strategies for talking to children with language delays (and helping  them to talk) and provide an overview of theoretical approaches to disorders of a semantic and pragmatic character. This discussion is very well complemented by Gerhard Schaden's response, which helps to situate clinical pragmatics in relation to theoretical pragmatics, as well as to cognitive approaches in relation to "behavioral" approaches. This pair of chapters is a good example of the variety of approaches in pragmatics and the current collaboration between linguists, therapists and philosophers in this area.

The next two chapters also form a particularly apt target/response pair. Max Kölbel's essay is a thorough discussion of François Recanati's book Perspectival Thought (2007), and it is Recanati himself who responds. Particularly interesting are Kölbel's qualms about Recanati's apparent identification of his notion of "lekta" with the notion of semantic content. If such an identification is there, Recanati could be a denier of unarticulated constituents, which seems quite incompatible with his own views as expressed in other works such as, for example, Literal Meaning (2004). Recanati's distinction between the notion of unarticulated constituents and free pragmatic enrichment in his response is most welcome, because it is not only Kölbel who has taken the former to be a particular product of the latter. I say more about this below. Other hot topics in the recent philosophical discussion of semantics and pragmatics, such as issues like faultless disagreements when using aesthetic predicates or epistemic modals, and the notion of what is said, are also clearly and distinctly discussed in these two excellent papers.

Part III starts with Philippe de Brabanter's impressive essay on quotation. After a thorough survey of the main competing theories and the identification of its varieties, he argues for a depiction theory of quotation, which he takes to be fundamentally pragmatic and, therefore, "not primarily a linguistic phenomenon." In his response, Raphael Salkie agrees that quotation is pragmatic, but expresses various doubts about depiction theory. This is the last of the target/response pairs in the volume, and it shows once again how this structure contributes to a better understanding of the various issues involved in a volume with such a diversity of contents.

Ilse Depraetere offers a meticulous empirical study of the various contributions that "have" can make to the content of utterances when it accompanies a modal verb (like "may", "can", "might", "could", "must" and "should") followed by a perfect infinitive. Then Depraetere considers the semantic or pragmatic nature of the different contributions of "have," or more precisely, whether it is a case of saturation or free enrichment, using these notions along the lines of Chapter 2.

Nicolas Ruytenbeek provides an extensive review of various decades of experimental work on indirect requests. Kate Scott, offers a very interesting presentation of a relevance-theoretic approach to contrastive stress. The final chapter, Chapter 19, by Billy Clark, works as a sort of epilogue for the whole volume.

I turn now to elaborate, just a bit, on a couple of issues that are important if one is interested in near-side pragmatics and the primary pragmatic processes (henceforth PPPs) that operate at this level of utterance comprehension. The first is about the notions of saturation and free enrichment, which are two main varieties of PPPs. In principle, saturation is roughly equivalent to the provision of referents for (overt or covert) indexicals or other expressions that provide slots to be contextually filled; thus, it is considered to be linguistically mandated. Free enrichment (FE) covers various processes of modulation, narrowing, strengthening, and specification of meaning that are supposed to be free, that is, optional. Both sorts of PPP are opposed to secondary pragmatic processes of implicature inference. In their joint contribution (Chapter 2), the editors make three controversial claims about these notions. First, they identify saturation with completion, and free enrichment with expansion. Second, they assimilate disambiguation processes to saturation (or completion), and specifying processes to free enrichment (or expansion). And third, they assume that saturation is semantic while free enrichment is pragmatic. Since both "completion" and "expansion" notions were put forward by Bach (1994), his response is especially welcome.

According to Bach, both completion and expansion are pragmatic: they have to do with what a speaker means by uttering a sentence, and not with what the sentence means. Besides, neither saturation nor disambiguation is a case of completion. "In both cases", he says, "the sentence's meaning in context is narrowed down to a single proposition. The need for completion, on the other hand, arises because the sentence's meaning in context falls short of comprising a proposition" (p. 48). It seems that Bach's disagreements go beyond these points, and affect the line between semantics and pragmatics. He offers a couple of interesting paragraphs (pp. 44-45) on the issue.

Let me now treat a different but related topic. Max Kölbel raises an interesting point concerning unarticulated constituents (UCs) (Perry 1986) that may present a problem of inconsistency between Recanati's account of the notion of what is said as presented in Literal Meaning (2004) and other works, on the one hand, and the notion of lekton as presented in Perspectival Thought (2007), on the other. Recanati's notion of lekton is fully articulated, which means that it doesn't contain any unarticulated constituent like, for instance, the location for an utterance of "It's raining." All the constituents in the lekton correspond to linguistic expressions of the sentence uttered, and all unarticulated constituents are part of the context of evaluation, which is an aspect of the complete content of the utterance -- part of an Austinian proposition. Recanati's 2004 notion of (enriched) what is said, however, is the result of linguistic meaning and PPPs that include free enrichment and, in particular, the provision of unarticulated constituents. Or so it is understood by Max Kölbel, and many others (like most authors of the volume). So, if this is right, we have two options: either (i) Recanati holds two different but possibly compatible notions of what is said -- the enriched what is said which includes unarticulated constituents, on the one hand, and the lekton, on the other, which is fully articulated and locates UCs in the Austinian proposition -- or,(ii) despite the synonymy of the terms lekton and "what is said," Recanati does not use them to denote the same notion, and uses the first for a minimalist proposition (with saturation but with no free enrichment) and the second for the complete Austinian proposition, or for an equivalence class of Austinian propositions.

In his response, Recanati makes various clarifying remarks on his notions of unarticulated constituents and free pragmatic enrichment. As he says, free pragmatic enrichment "is often interpreted as the provision of 'unarticulated constituents'" (p. 219). This is also how most authors in the volume interpreted it,[1] but this is not Recanati's interpretation. He takes the product of free enrichment processes to be articulated, because it corresponds to the lexical item whose meaning has been enriched. So, there is no inconsistency in positing a level of what is said, the lekton, which is both enriched and fully articulated.

Still, as far as I can see, even if there is no "significant tension" between the notions of what is said in Literal Meaning and the lekton in Perspectival Thought, there seems to remain a significant difference: the first includes UCs, the second doesn't. Recanati says it is the lekton, and not the enriched what-is-said, that provides the input for the inference of implicatures. But there are many examples in which the proposition including the UC seems to be required to infer the right implicature. In Perry's (1986) original example, for instance, when Jim utters "It's raining," John, in order to infer that he can go back to sleep, needs to understand that the relevant place is Palo Alto, the place of the utterance in the example. I guess Recanati can reply that we can take this case as a case of modulation of the verb "to rain," and not as a case of UC. This is not the approach he favors in Perspectival Thought, though. In any case, if not conclusive, the discussion helps in tying up a few loose ends that readers of Recanati's numerous writings on semantics and pragmatics might find. And, to repeat, this is just one of the many interesting discussions in this rich and diverse volume. Unfortunately, space limits dictate that we cannot deal with more of them.

To conclude, I want to insist upon the following point. The book offers an extraordinary variety of specimens of collaboration between philosophers, linguists, and logicians on cross-boundary topics in semantics and pragmatics. As I said above, the book is not exactly about the line between these two disciplines. But that doesn't matter much. Perhaps there is no big theoretical or practical interest in such boundary debates, anyway. Perhaps, as John Searle once put it, "we should leave these boundary disputes to university deans" (Searle 1992: p. 146).

It seems obvious, however, that semantics and pragmatics are too serious to leave them in the hands of logicians and linguists alone; or to philosophers alone, for that matter. Cappelen (forthcoming) claims that philosophers shouldn't do semantics; and I suppose he would be keen to extend the advice to pragmatics as well. I disagree. I am more sympathetic to Jackendoff when he says that he is "interested in constructing a stance on meaning from which it is possible to make sense of the sort of detailed empirical investigation that linguists do. The relation between philosophy and the dirty work has to be a two-way street." (Jackendoff 2002: 268). In this volume, linguists and philosophers show the benefits of travelling back and forth on such a street. Even if the varieties of topics, approaches and methodologies may end up being a bit overwhelming, everyone with an interest in cross-boundaries research in semantics and (near-side) pragmatics will find much to chew on in this volume.


I am grateful to Eros Corazza and María de Ponte for comments and criticisms, and to the grants of the Basque Government (IT1032-16) and the Spanish Government (FFI2015-63719-P (MINECO/FEDER)) for support.


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Cappelen, Herman (forthcoming). Why philosophers shouldn't do semantics. Review of Philosophy and Psychology. Special Issue on Key Topics in Philosophy of Language and Mind, R. Carston and K. Korta (eds.).

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[1] Elsewhere he admits that “In earlier writings … I did contribute to the confusion by describing free enrichment—a form of modulation—as the provision of unarticulated constituents” (Recanati 2010: 22).