Semantics for Reasons

Placeholder book cover

Bryan R. Weaver and Kevin Scharp, Semantics for Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2019, 166pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198832621.

Reviewed by Mark Schroeder, University of Southern California


In this book, Bryan R. Weaver and Kevin Scharp promise to bring clarity to the messiness of philosophical theorizing about reasons by providing a semantics for 'reason' as a count noun in ordinary English. Weaving through a wide range of topics connected to reasons, they take especially sharp aim at theorists who have called the distinction between different contents expressible using the word 'reason' a matter of ambiguity. In place of the ambiguity thesis, and of the idea that 'reason' is polysemous, and of agnosticism about why 'reason' can be said in many ways, they place great weight on the fact that their semantics is contextualist, distinguishing between different contents expressed by the same words in different contexts of utterance. Since on their view, contexts of utterance are distinguished by the Questions Under Discussion in those contexts, they call their view QUD-contextualism.

The central idea of QUD-contextualism is that, of eight possible contents for 'reason', the one expressed in a given context of utterance is a matter of which question is under discussion in that context. They do this by constructing a lookup table that tells us what it is. For example, if the question under discussion is whether or not the object in question is obligatory in light of the way the world is independently of the agent's mental states, then 'X is a reason for A to j in S' expresses the content that X is an obligating objective normative reason for A to j in S. And if the question under discussion is why some aspect of the world could be the way that it is, then 'X is a reason for A to j in S' expresses the content that X is an explanatory reason how A could have j-ed. And so on for their list of six other possible contents.

You have questions. I do, too. What if the question under discussion is not one of the eight very specific QUD's on Weaver and Scharp's list? For example, what if the question on your mind as you read this review is what I think of their book? Or what if the question under discussion is whether there is any reason to read their book? They simply don't say -- apparently the character of 'reason' claims is undefined relative to those contexts, and so there is no reason to think that it means anything in the context of this review.

Or what if the question under discussion is what an agent is obligated to do in light of the way the world is independently of the agent's mental states -- i.e., the question whose answers are given by {A is obligated to j, A is obligated to y, A is obligated to z} -- rather than the question whose answers are given by {A is obligated to j, A is not obligated to j}? Apparently the character of 'reason' is again silent, and 'reason' sentences do not have contents in such contexts.

Similarly, what if the question under discussion is complex, seeking an answer to whether or not the object is obligatory in light of the way the world is independently of the agent's mental states and why that could be the way that it is? Couldn't 'X is a reason for A to j in S' express either a content about objective normative reasons or about explanatory reasons? Once again, the lookup table that constitutes Weaver and Scharp's elucidation of the character of 'reason' tells us no. It is again undefined for such contexts of utterance.

So, what then if the sentence that we wish to interpret is 'X is the reason why Y is a reason for A to j in S'? Fortunately, Weaver and Scharp's account can set straight any confusion about whether the two appearances of 'reason' in this sentence might receive different interpretations, since both have to receive their interpretation from the question under discussion in the context of utterance. No wonder metaethicists have been confused.

An analogy would be helpful. Some say that 'bank' is ambiguous. But the framework of QUD-contextualism allows us to see how to overcome this mistake and see how it could be context-dependent. By analogy to Weaver and Scharp's view, in contexts in which the question under discussion is where, when, why, who, how, or whether to deposit money, the content of 'bank' is a financial institution, while in contexts in which the question under discussion is whether or when the river will flood, the content of 'bank' is the edge of a river. Illuminatingly, this account provides a treatment of 'the bank the teller works at is on the south bank' that is exactly as attractive as that which Weaver and Scharp provide of 'X is the reason why Y is the reason for A to j in S'.

In general, appeals to semantic context-dependence are illuminating when they appeal to a common core meaning. 'They are not ready' is contextually variant due to the context-dependence of 'ready', because 'they are not ready for bed' and 'they are not ready to publish' express thoughts that have something in common -- being unready for something -- and differ only in what it is being said that they are not ready for. Similarly, Angelika Kratzer's powerful contextualist treatment of modal terms tells us that 'they must not read' expresses in any context the thought that they do not read in all of the worlds that are consistent with some background and preferred by some ordering -- differing only in which background and ordering are in question.

Weaver and Scharp's view is not at all like these, nor does it come with any of the familiar advantages of such views, other than the label of being 'context-dependent'. But by the time the only unity exhibited by a term's character is that of a lookup table, we might do well to wonder why this label is so important, and whether, as in the 'bank' example, the clues that come from the question under discussion are simply what we would expect if 'reason' is in fact straightforwardly ambiguous, and hence relevant (under different meanings) for discussing different questions -- as of course is true of all pure ambiguities.

In order to contort their semantics into a strict form of context-dependence, however, Weaver and Scharp commit to the view that the argument structure of normative, motivating, and explanatory reasons is all the same. So 'the reason for which they rejected QUD-contextualism as implausible' can refer to the objective normative reason for them to reject QUD-contextualism as implausible (even if they did not actually reject it) and 'the reason for them to reject QUD-contextualism as implausible' can refer to the explanatory reason why they did, in fact, reject QUD-contextualism as implausible. The only difference is which questions are under discussion in the context!

I conjecture, however, that you did not find both readings equally available of each sentence in the foregoing paragraph. On Weaver and Scharp's view, this must be because different questions were under discussion at different points in that paragraph, since the matter of which question is under discussion definitively resolves context ambiguity, and nothing about syntax or sentence structure, which are equally eligible for every context. But there are no good reasons to think that the order of questions under discussion goes in the order that this explanation requires -- indeed, further reflection will reveal that it is quite incoherent to attribute the appropriate questions under discussion.

By helping themselves to a stipulated list of central canonical 'reason' sentences, Weaver and Scharp have simply ignored discontinuities between the grammar of natural sentences which can be used to express the different readings of 'reason', such as those that I have exhibited here, with literally no comment in the book. For a volume that aims to reconcile motivating and normative senses of 'reason' to a single context-dependent character, this should have been the central task, but it receives no mention at all, anywhere in the entire book.

Yet somehow Weaver and Scharp manage to combine a positive view with so little to recommend it with dismissive -- contemptuous, in many cases -- remarks about other philosophers throughout the book, nearly all of them based on grossly uncharitable readings. Just to take one example, they dismiss Stephen Finlay's contextualist account of 'reason' in just four pages in chapter four. The most probing problem that they isolate for Finlay is that his account links the meaning of the word 'reason' to the meaning of the word 'good', which results, Weaver and Scharp observe, in an ambiguity in 'reason', because of an underlying ambiguity that Finlay posits in the word 'good'! If not for the fact that Weaver and Scharp have taught us in chapter two to be so careful about distinguishing between ambiguity and contextual variation, we could overlook the fact that Finlay's book is in fact a detailed defense of a kind of contextualism, among whose central claims is that 'good' is context-dependent, rather than ambiguous. Chapter four then continues in this vein of uncharitable engagement for another eighteen pages.

The volume's weaknesses come as an especially great disappointment, because there is so much room for more detailed, careful engagement with philosophical work on reasons that brings to bear a more sophisticated and careful understanding of background issues in the philosophy of language and linguistic semantics. It would be incredibly lovely to have a book that engages carefully in this space, educates rather than browbeats its readers, and distinguishes between areas of reasonable controversy and questions whose answers should be clear. This book is not that book. It is full of unsupported sweeping claims, substantive stipulations of what is true that are unaccompanied by arguments, deeply uncharitable readings of others' positions, overly uncritical reliance on some claims defended by other authors (in some cases my own), an arrogant and contemptuous tone toward other authors that is particularly out of place in light of how undeveloped their own view is and how uncareful its own development, and a pervasive sense that it is the job of philosophers to tell each other how it is okay to talk, rather than to work to make sense of one another.

But even separate from the question of whether their view is promising (a context in consideration of which, just to remind you, is one in which 'reason' does not have any fixed content), this is a disappointing way to do philosophy. Moral philosophers don't need to be told what they are allowed to say -- though they may appreciate being told how to say what they want to say. And that is a reason to do that, instead.