Semantics, Metasemantics, Aboutness

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Ori Simchen, Semantics, Metasemantics, Aboutness, Oxford University Press, 2017, 159 pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198892147.

Reviewed by Derek Ball, University of St Andrews


This book is a study of the consequences of different metasemantic views for debates about the indeterminacy of reference, self-reference, and legal interpretation. As Simchen sees things, the leading question of metasemantics is: "What determines that expressions have their semantic significance?" (2), and the main divide in metasemantic theorizing is between productivist ways of answering this question -- on which semantic significance is determined by conditions associated with the production of the significant item -- and interpretationist ways of answering it -- on which semantic significance is determined by "conditions of interpretative consumption" (4). Simchen sees views that try to explain semantic significance in terms of speaker intentions, or in terms of causal history, as the paradigms of productivism (so the likes of Donnellan, Kaplan, and Kripke are his paradigmatic productivists). The paradigmatic interpretationist view is Davidsonian; on this view, "What determines that expressions have their semantic significance is their interpretability so as to engender a good explanation of speakers' rationality in thought and talk given their worldly surroundings" (8). The main thrust of the first two chapters is that productivism is to be preferred to interpretationism; later chapters explore what Simchen takes to be further consequences of his productivist stance.

Simchen is particularly interested in (what he sees as) the Lewisian version of interpretationism, especially as developed in Sider (2011), which adds to the Davidsonian view that semantic significance is determined by interpretability the claim that assignments of semantic significance are constrained by "reference magnetism", the idea that assignments must "optimize the naturalness of semantic values assigned to the predicates" (8). The appeal to naturalness is needed to avoid the threat of underdetermination. For example, on one typical interpretationist strategy, we ought to interpret so as to make as many as possible of a speaker's beliefs and utterances true; but there will always be many ways to do this. So we need some way of picking out a unique interpretation as correct. The idea of reference magnetism is that the correct interpretation is the one that maximizes naturalness.

As Simchen presents the debate, this way of motivating the appeal to naturalness depends on the assumption of global descriptivism: the idea that aside from naturalness, the only constraint on interpretations is that they make our assertions and beliefs true. On this view, any putative alternative metasemantics is (as Putnam put it) "just more theory" -- further object-language sentences, the truth of which is to be delivered by our interpretation. Thus, for example, a causal theory amounts to (something like) the proposal that sentences like "'Cat' refers to the dominant cause of tokens of 'cat"' should be added to the collection of object-language sentences that the semantic theory is in the business of interpreting. But viewed in this way, the causal theory won't help with underdetermination, since there will be many ways of interpreting "cause" so as to make theories that include the sentence true.

Simchen's response is to reject the idea that metasemantic claims should be regarded as "just more theory". Lewis himself denied that the theory of reference magnetism was just more sentences to be made true by some interpretation or other: "the proposed constraint is that referents are to be eligible, not just that eligibility-theory is to be satisfied somehow, not just that the referents of 'cat' etc. are to be included among the referents of 'eligible"' (1984: 228). Similarly, Simchen insists that productivists (like the causal theorist) are not simply delivering sentences of the object language to be made true by some interpretation or other. His proposal is instead that (e.g.) causation determines reference, not that the causal theory be satisfied somehow, not that the referent of "causation" is to be included among the referents of "determines reference".

But it isn't clear that this tells against the idea that metasemantic theory needs to appeal to naturalness. Lewis's own preferred view situates this appeal in the context of a global descriptivism, but he acknowledges the possibility of other views and argues that naturalness must play a role in them as well. For example, noting that we must have some constraint on meaning that is not "just more theory", Lewis writes, "Many philosophers would suggest that it is some sort of causal constraint. If so my case [that metasemantic theory needs to appeal to naturalness] is made" (1983: 371) because he takes the notion of naturalness to be crucial to an account of causation. Sider likewise writes:

Causal theories say that reference is a certain sort of causal relation, and it's arguably built into the nature of causation that only reasonably joint-carving relations are causal. So causal metasemantics may not need reference magnetism. Even so, joint-carving remains crucial to metasemantics, via its connection to causation. (2011: 30n16)

So, even if Simchen's productivism can do without reference magnetism per se, it remains to be shown that it can do without some very similar appeal to naturalness.

Simchen offers a further interesting consideration against the interpretationist idea that metasemantics can aim to offer an interpretation of sub-sentential expressions on the basis of the assumption that certain sentences are true. The argument is simple: as long as we maintain that "Sentential truth depends on aboutness for sub-sentential expressions" (26), we cannot explain the aboutness of sub-sentential expressions in terms of sentential truth on pain of explanatory circularity. And Simchen sees related considerations as motivating his insistence that metasemantics should not be construed as "just more theory": the claim that "cat" refers to the dominant cause of "cats" is not explanatorily equivalent to the claim that the sentence "'Cat' refers to the dominant cause of 'cats"' is true, since the former but not the latter can play a role in explaining sentential truth.

Simchen follows this with a further argument against interpretationism: an underdetermination challenge that the productivist is uniquely well situated to answer. Typical underdetermination challenges focus on the idea that there are many ways of assigning interpretations to predicates, singular terms, and other expressions, that would make our utterances and beliefs come out true. Lewis's response was to impose a further restriction: roughly, to throw away any assignment that fails to maximize naturalness. Simchen observes, in effect, that Lewis needs a further ingredient if this response is to have a chance of securing determinacy: he needs to assume determinacy about the relation the interpretations of various sub-sentential expressions must bear to each other if sentences involving them are to be true. For example, a standard assumption would be that a sentence of the form "Fa" is true if and only if the referent of "a" is in the extension of "F". But (as Simchen points out) there are alternatives; for example, we might consider a "scrambler" function G that maps referents to alternative referents, and hold that a sentence of the form "Fa" is true if and only if G maps the referent of "a" onto something in the extension of "F". There will always be many ways of assigning interpretations to expressions that make our utterances and beliefs true on some scrambling even if we insist that the interpretations maximize naturalness; so, if these scrambled relations are live options, the Lewisian appeal to naturalness does not eliminate indeterminacy.

So, Simchen claims, resisting underdetermination requires resisting scrambled notions of truth. And he claims that productivism is better positioned to do this. It is intuitive, Simchen claims, that sentential truth is "local per produced reference" (52), in the sense that the truth of sentence like "Obama smokes" "should turn directly on how things stand with" (52) the referent of "Obama". The productivist is entitled to appeal to this intuitive constraint to rule out scrambled notions of truth; the interpretationist, Simchen claims, cannot. (This crucial bit of the argument is treated very quickly and I am not sure I understand it; but one argument that seems consonant with considerations Simchen raises elsewhere would be that the interpretationist maintains that reference is determined by sentential truth, and not vice-versa.)

Later chapters apply the productivist idea to the distinction between "natural and intuitive verdicts of aboutness -- verdicts concerning what it is that we talk about in saying what we say" (69) and technical notions of semantic value (Simchen defends a "limited instrumentalism" about the latter); self-reference (Simchen argues that there is no proper self-reference); and (interestingly) legal interpretation (where Simchen defends Dworkin against Scalia by arguing that the former is best read as endorsing a productivist metasemantics and the latter as endorsing an interpretationist metasemantics).

There are several points at which the book skimps on detail. No worked out productivist account is ever defended or even discussed (though there is an interesting but brief appendix on how the productivist might handle reference to mathematical entities). Indeed, the distinction between productivism and interpretationism is not made very clear (to me at least). There are several ideas in the mix; perhaps the two most central ones are (i) that meaning is a matter of interpretation, construed as a kind of activity, something one thinker does or could do to another (as Simchen says, interpretationism maintains "that the significance of expressions is constituted by their interpretability, whether by an actual linguistic actor or by an idealized version thereof" (53)); and (ii) that what one means is determined by what one asserts and believes, and, in particular, that the correct assignment of meanings to sub-sentential expressions is one that maximises the truth of one's assertions and beliefs. These two doctrines seem entirely separable. One might, for example, affirm (i) but also maintain that the best interpretations will rely on something other than making true assertions and beliefs -- perhaps one's conscious states, one's actions, or indeed the causal sources of one's linguistic acts will play a crucial role in interpretation. Or one might deny (i) but affirm (ii): perhaps "Obama" as you use it refers to Obama because you are disposed to assert things like "Obama was president of the USA" and (given other constraints) this is true only if "Obama" refers to Obama -- and all that is simply a fact about the metaphysics of meaning which has nothing to do with the activities of any actual or hypothetical interpreter. Indeed, this seems to have been Lewis's view: in the paper in which he most explicitly develops the notion of interpretation, he writes:

I am not really asking how we could determine these facts [i.e., the facts about meaning and content]. Rather: how do the facts determine these facts? By what constraints, and to what extent, does the totality of physical facts about Karl determine what he believes, desires, and means? To speak of a mighty knower, who uses his knowledge of these constraints to advance from omniscience about the physical facts P to omniscience about the other facts determined thereby, is a way of dramatizing our problem - safe enough, so long as we can take it or leave it alone (1974: 333-4).

Simchen's presentations of interpretationism suggest that his target is (i); but his arguments seem most effective against versions of (ii). In either case, it is far from clear that there is a single issue here that ought to be seen as the primary focus of metasemantic debate.

Nonetheless, there is much of interest in the book, and I hope that the discussion of the seeming explanatory circularity of metasemantic appeals to sentential truth, the scrambled truth argument, the discussion of the relation between semantic value and less technical semantic notions, and the attempt to link metasemantics with issues in law -- among much else -- will be read and discussed.


Lewis, D. (1974). Radical interpretation. Synthese, 27, 331-344.

Lewis, D. (1983). New work for a theory of universals. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 61, 343-377.

Lewis, D. (1984). Putnam's paradox. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 62, 221-236.

Sider, T. (2011). Writing the Book of the World. New York: Oxford University Press.