Semantics Versus Pragmatics

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Zoltan Gendler Szabó, ed., Semantics Versus Pragmatics, Oxford University Press, 2005, 476pp, $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199251525.

Reviewed by Lenny Clapp, Illinois Wesleyan University


Semantics Versus Pragmatics is a collection of ten papers by some of the most influential contemporary analytic philosophers of language, preceded by an informative and accessible introduction by the book's editor. The book is important because the papers it contains reflect a wide range of views concerning the lively debate that is currently taking place concerning how, and whether, the distinction between pragmatics and semantics is to be drawn. Characterizing the central issue in this way, however, is somewhat misleading as it suggests that the issue concerns merely how the technical terms 'semantic' and 'pragmatic' are to be used. Though there is a terminological aspect to the debate, it would be a mistake to suppose at the outset that the issue is merely terminological. In what follows I will first characterize the central issue without using 'semantic' or 'pragmatic', thereby supporting the view that the central issue is not merely about how this jargon is to be used. I will then introduce the ten papers in the volume, showing that each paper adopts one of three general perspectives on the central issue. Finally, I will briefly describe what I take to be the central challenge faced by each of these three general perspectives.

Consider a particular instance of a declarative grammatical sentence, say my utterance of 'She smokes'. In the typical sort of case, my utterance of this sentence to you will result in your forming a wide range of beliefs: You will come to believe that I just uttered a sentence, that I believe of some female person or other that she smokes. And perhaps, if you trust me and understand me, you will come to believe that a particular female person, whomever I refer to with my utterance of 'she', smokes. Let us call all the beliefs that my utterance causes you to have the informational effects of my utterance. Now only a proper part of the informational effects of my utterance are communicated by my utterance, for many of the informational effects, e.g. that at the time of the utterance I was not suffering from acute laryngitis, are unintended informational effects of my utterance; only beliefs that I intended you to form as a result of my utterance are communicated by my utterance. Moreover, only a proper part of the communicated information is plausibly construed as what I said, where what I said is that portion of the communicated information that is relevant for determining the truth or falsity of my utterance. For example, my utterance probably communicated that I believe that a certain female person, say Uma Thurman, smokes, but it seems that I did not say anything about my beliefs concerning the smoking habits of Uma Thurman or anything else. For, suppose I was being disingenuous -- suppose I did not believe that Uma Thurman smokes. But further suppose that I was wrong -- Uma Thurman does smoke. If, subsequent to my utterance, you were to discover all this, you could chastise me for being disingenuous, but you could not accuse me of saying something false: If Uma Thurman smokes, and I uttered 'She smokes', where my utterance of 'she' referred to Uma Thurman, then what I said was true, regardless of the false communicated information that I believe Uma Thurman smokes. Some aspects of what is communicated by my utterance result from (your tacit knowledge of) context-invariant properties and features, i.e. the conventional meaning, of the sentence-type I uttered. For example, the fact that much of the information I communicate concerns some female person, as opposed to, say motorcycles, is due to the fact that the third-person pronoun 'she' appears in the sentence-type I uttered. But much of what I communicate, and at least some of what I said, is not determined by such context-invariant features and properties of the uttered sentence. For example, that in making my utterance what I said was about Uma Thurman, and not Nancy Reagan, cannot be gleaned from the conventional meaning of the sentence-type, for the sentence-type could, in another context, be used to say of Nancy Reagan that she smokes. Thus, that my utterance communicated information about Uma Thurman, and moreover that what I said was about Uma Thurman, was somehow dependent upon features of the particular context in which my utterance occurred.

According to the orthodox view (often attributed to Grice), even though the context-invariant features and properties of an uttered sentence do not suffice to determine what is said by utterances of the sentence, there is nonetheless a tight connection between these context-invariant features and properties and what is said by utterances of the sentence-type. According to this orthodox view, once one resolves the lexical and structural ambiguities (i.e. determines the logical form) and determines all the referents invoked by the utterance, including the referents of all the context-sensitive elements in the uttered sentence, one thereby -- as a consequence of semantic compositionality -- fixes what is said by the utterance. Recently, however, this orthodox view has come under pressure from a barrage of apparent counterexamples. The apparent counterexamples have the following general structure: there are two utterances, u and u', (typically of the same sentence-type) where all that is supposed to be relevant for fixing what is said -- logical form and invoked referents -- is the same between u and u', but nonetheless what is said by u and u' is intuitively different; u and u' not only communicate different information, they moreover have distinct truth-conditions. For example, consider two utterances of 'She only smokes'. Even if the overtly context-sensitive 'she' has the same referent in both contexts of utterance, the intuitive truth-conditions of the two utterances might differ. (I am here ignoring tense.) For example, one utterance of 'She only smokes' might be true iff Uma Thurman smokes cigarettes, but does not drink alcohol, while another utterance might be true iff Uma Thurman smokes opium, but does not eat opium. The problem for the orthodox view is that this difference in what is said occurs even though everything that is supposed to fix what is said (logical form and invoked referents) in the two utterances at least appears to be the same. The central issue that underlies all the papers in Semantics Versus Pragmatics concerns what perspective one ought to adopt concerning such apparent counterexamples against the orthodox view.

One might think that the appropriate perspective to adopt in response to the apparent counterexamples is to simply reject the core idea of the orthodox view, viz. that there is a tight connection between the context-invariant features and properties of a sentence-type and what is said by utterances of the sentence-type. From this first perspective, which (following Neale) I will call pragmatism, the context-invariant features and properties of a sentence-type, the conventional meaning, are insufficient to determine what is said by an utterance of the sentence, and additional contextually-bound properties and processes must come into play. The perspective of pragmatism is represented by six of the papers in the volume. In "Pragmatism and Binding," Stephen Neale first introduces the fundamental ideas of pragmatism by way of twenty-four "points." From the theoretical perspective thus introduced he addresses the vexing question of the relationship between bound, anaphoric, and deictic occurrences of pronouns: Are pronouns semantically ambiguous so that these different sorts of occurrence correspond to different conventional meanings? Or are these different sorts of occurrence the result of different uses of one semantically unambiguous term? Neale argues -- and this is somewhat surprising given his allegiance to pragmatism -- that there is substantial empirical evidence suggesting that some English pronouns are semantically ambiguous. The same issue is addressed by François Recanati in his paper, "Deixis and Anaphora," though Recanati argues -- as one might expect a defender of pragmatism to argue -- that the different occurrences of pronouns do not result from semantic ambiguity, but are instead results of the same word being put to different uses. Another vexing phenomenon -- vexing from the perspective of the orthodox view -- is that of presupposition, and this is the topic of Mandy Simons' paper, "Presupposition and Relevance." Simons approaches the phenomenon from the perspective of relevance theory (a version of pragmatism), and argues that the presuppositions of an utterance are the propositions the hearer must accept if the utterance is to be relevant for him. Robert Stainton's paper "In Defense of Non-Sentential Assertion" defends counterexamples involving non-sentential assertions -- e.g. a use of the fragment 'completely insane' to assert that a particular person is insane -- from objections raised by defenders of the orthodox view. After defending the legitimacy of such counter-examples, Stainton further argues that, contrary to what defenders of the orthodox view seem to think, its demise is compatible with the very plausible thesis that linguistic communication is very different from other sorts of communication. Scott Soames' paper "Naming and Asserting" is a particularly interesting contribution to the pragmatism cause, because in it Soames argues against his previous endorsement of the orthodox view. (See Soames, Beyond Rigidity, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.) It is consideration of counterexamples involving propositional-attitude ascriptions that leads to Soames' rejection of the orthodox view: Soames argues that the price of maintaining a tight connection between what is said and the context-invariant features and properties of a sentence is being forced to deny that what is said by an utterances is always communicated by the utterance. Soames finds this price too high, and he thus abandons the orthodox view. Finally, in "Context ex Machina," Kent Bach draws some important distinctions and argues in support of a position that lies somewhere between the orthodox view and pragmatism. In accordance with the orthodox view, Bach claims that the "conventional meaning" of an uttered sentence suffices to determine what is said by the sentence (though Bach cautions that this sentence meaning is not be confused with what the speaker meant by performing the utterance). But, in conflict with the orthodox view, Bach maintains that what is said by some sentences is not fully propositional; some grammatical declarative sentences do not express truth-conditions. For such "semantically incomplete" sentences, an interpreter must engage contextually bound pragmatic processes in order to determine some truth-evaluable content, and in this respect Bach's view is a version of pragmatism.

The remaining four papers advocate amending the orthodox view in light of apparent counterexamples rather than rejecting it, but there are two general perspectives concerning how it should be amended. The first such perspective, which I call semantic maximalism, responds to the apparent divergence between context-invariant features and properties of sentence-types and what is said by utterances of those types by positing more relevant context-invariant features and properties. Thus, when faced with an apparent counterexample involving what appear to be relevantly similar utterances u and u' which intuitively say different things, semantic maximalism rejects the premise that u and u' have the same logical form and invoke the same referents (or semantic values). A paradigmatic version of semantic maximalism is represented by Jeffrey King and Jason Stanley in their paper, "Semantics, Pragmatics, and the Role of Semantic Content," and a more nuanced version is defended in Michael Glanzberg's paper, "Focus: A Case-Study on the Semantics-Pragmatics Boundary." King and Stanley begin by criticizing the other perspectives on the central issue (though they refer to pragmatism as "semantic skepticism" and semantic minimalism as "semantic modesty") and then they address a number of related counterexamples. King and Stanley's analyses of the apparent counterexamples involve an interaction between two sorts of factors: (i) effects of focus, which King and Stanley treat as a "weak pragmatic effect" that is not does directly affect truth-conditions and is not represented in logical form; and (ii) "hidden indexicals," i.e. context-sensitive elements in logical form that are not phonetically realized, or at least are not overtly indexical. Glanzberg also considers apparent counterexamples that involve the phenomenon of focus, though, in contrast to King and Stanley, Glanzberg treats focus as being represented in logical form and as directly affecting truth-conditions.

The second perspective that endorses amending the orthodox view responds to the apparent divergence between context-invariant features and properties of sentence-types and what is said by utterances of those types by distinguishing between what is really said by an utterance and what is intuitively said. Thus, when faced with an apparent counterexample involving relevantly similar utterances u and u' which apparently say different things, semantic minimalism rejects the premise that what is said by u and u' is really different. According to semantic minimalism, what is really said by an uttered sentence is always truth-evaluable, but the genuine, semantic, truth-conditions of an uttered sentence almost always differ from the intuitive truth-conditions of the utterance itself. Semantic minimalism is defended by Herman Cappelen and Ernie Lepore in their paper "Radical and Moderate Pragmatics: Does Meaning Determine Truth Conditions?" and also in Nathan Salmon's paper "Two Conceptions of Semantics." (Semantic minimalism is also the position criticized and abandoned in Soames' paper.) Cappelen and Lepore's paper is primarily a criticism of pragmatism which proceeds in three steps: First, they distinguish between "moderate pragmatism" and "radical pragmatism"; second, they argue that moderate pragmatism collapses into radical pragmatism; and, third, they argue that radical pragmatism is internally inconsistent. Salmon's paper is also primarily concerned to criticize pragmatism. He first criticizes what many take to be the historical foundations of pragmatism, the so-called "use theory of meaning," and he then argues in support of "the expression centered conception of semantics," which is roughly equivalent to semantic minimalism.

As I do not here have the space to adequately address any of the arguments presented in the papers in any detail, I will conclude by describing in general terms what I take to be the central challenge facing each of the three perspectives. The main threat against semantic minimalism is this: Semantic minimalism insulates the orthodox view from the apparent counterexamples by making a hard distinction between the truth-conditions of an uttered sentence and the intuitive truth-conditions of the utterance (or what the speaker meant by making the utterance). But because it separates the orthodox view from utterances in this way, semantic minimalism runs the risk of making the orthodox view completely irrelevant to the study of natural language. If the minimal, purely semantic, truth-conditions of a sentence diverge drastically from the intuitive truth-conditions actual speakers interpret an utterance of the sentence as expressing -- and in order to undermine the alleged counterexamples the semantic minimalist must allow for such divergence -- then what is the point of assigning such theoretical truth-conditions to sentences? Since actual language users do not judge sentences to have such minimal truth-conditions, what explanatory work could such an assignment play? Semantic minimalism runs the risk of preserving the orthodox view only by rendering it explanatorily irrelevant with regard to actual linguistic understanding and communication.

Semantic maximalism attempts to preserve a tight connection between the context invariant features and properties of a sentence and the truth-conditions expressed by utterances of the sentence not by positing a special sort of truth-conditions tailor-made for the task, but rather by increasing the number and/or complexity of the relevant context-invariant features and properties. The main threat to semantic maximalism is that by always positing these additional resources in order to undermine apparent counterexamples, it will render the orthodox view explanatorily inert. Consider, for example, an apparent counterexample involving an indicative conditional: 'If gasoline is ignited, it explodes'. This sentence gives rise to apparent counterexamples because utterances of it express different truth-conditions depending upon all sorts of aspects of the context in which it is uttered: Said to a smoker at the neighborhood filling-station, we might judge it to be true, but said to an astronaut in outer-space, we might judge it to be false. The semantic maximalist can (and does) attempt to undermine such counterexamples by claiming that the indicative 'if … then', though not overtly context-sensitive like 'I' or 'now', is nonetheless a context-sensitive expression that refers to different logical relations in different contexts. But if the only reason for supposing that 'if … then' is referentially context-sensitive in this way is that doing so preserves the orthodox view, then the semantic maximalist cannot turn around and explain why we judge different utterances of the same indicative conditional to express different truth-conditions by appealing to the just supposed covert context-sensitivity of 'if … then'. Aside from the fact that positing this additional referential complexity enables one to preserve the orthodox view, what reason is there for thinking that 'if … then' constructions are referentially context-sensitive in this way? The problematic phenomenon of different utterances of the same indicative conditional expressing different intuitive truth-conditions in different contexts cannot be denied; but what reason independent of the orthodox view is there for supposing that this variance in truth-conditions is a result of referential context-sensitivity? If the semantic maximalist is to preserve the explanatory power of the orthodox view, she must provide independent reasons for supposing that the context-sensitive referential machinery she posits actually exists.

Finally, the main challenge facing pragmatism is that at present it is primarily a negative view, the essence of which is the rejection of the orthodox view. Thus the primary challenge facing the pragmatist is to provide a positive account of how interpreters arrive at intuitive judgments of what is said by utterances: If tacit knowledge of the logical form of, and the referents invoked by, an utterance do not suffice for making such a judgment, then what does suffice? Moreover, this positive account must provide a new explanation of the robust intuitive distinction between what is said by an utterance as opposed to what is merely communicated by the utterance. If this distinction is not to be drawn -- as it is on the orthodox view -- by appeal to information determined by context-invariant features and properties as opposed to information not so determined, then how is it to be drawn?

These are, in my view, the central challenges facing each of the three perspectives. In describing these challenges, I in no way intend to suggest that the advocates of each perspective are unaware of these challenges. Indeed, one of the reasons Semantics Versus Pragmatics is a valuable collection is that these challenges are addressed with insight and ingenuity, and in a wide variety of ways, by the contributors to the volume. All of this of course raises the fundamental question: Which perspective is correct? Alas, no clear answer to this question emerges from the volume. Taken as a whole, the papers in Semantics Versus Pragmatics do not point to any clear conclusion of the central issue, as I have described it; nor do they suggest that we are close to agreement concerning how the semantics/pragmatics distinction is to be drawn. They do, however, provide ample evidence that analytic philosophy of language is in the midst of a lively debate that has produced, and is likely to continue producing, important clarifications and insights.