Semblance and Event: Activist Philosophy and the Occurrent Arts

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Brian Massumi, Semblance and Event: Activist Philosophy and the Occurrent Arts, MIT Press, 2011, 220pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262134910.

Reviewed by James Williams, University of Dundee


Following ideas, images, sensations and intense affects charted by William James, Alfred North Whitehead and Gilles Deleuze, Brian Massumi invites us into an aesthetic meditation that is also a meditation on art. Among the most demanding of creative forms, meditations are at the same time pliable, seductive and powerfully divisive. They demand great craft and achieve wide resonance with their readers. Yet they are also capable of engendering disgust or baffled disinterest, most often when the expectations of the audience fall out of the range of the work or when the projected ideas meet with visceral opposition.

Semblance and Event satisfies all these conditions. It is a beautifully written piece with complex rhythms interweaving philosophy, aesthetics, science and art-practice. Yet this very weave is bound to shock, irritate or darkly amuse critics seeking pure forms in each of these disciplines. It is not that logical argument, abstract aesthetics, pure science and raw art-practice are absent from the book. They are sublimated. So the surface of the writing flows from reflection, scholarship and direct experience, revealing them in distilled form only. There is great beauty to this rarefication. Ideas and experiences are elevated above the heavy and messy work of construction, conflict and friction. Toil, frustration, struggle and abnegation are cloaked beneath the meditative unrolling.

Meditation calls for commentary. It also inspires. Sometimes, it meets with violent opposition. I will attempt some commentary in what follows and gesture to possible sources of inspiration. First, though, let's set the violent opposition aside, for there is little value in entering into the fruitless debate about differing standards of argument. If you are seeking a carefully argued, seamlessly logical, analytically constructed aesthetics or philosophy of art here, then forget it, this is not the book for you. If you are looking for an introduction or critique of James's or Whitehead's philosophies, this is again not for your eyes. As pictured in Isabelle Stengers's generous blurb, Massumi's prose achieves 'indiscernibility' between disciplines and experiences. It is 'participative' rather than critical. It does not introduce a set of thinkers, nor put their thought in academic context. Philosophies instead become part of hybrid acts. They become part of the action. This action is a participative meditation across art, science and philosophy.

As such, the book is resistant to simple logical dismemberment and to categorical situation in historical and disciplinary positions and lines. Does this matter? Yes, it probably does, but the place for any assessment of the conflicting demands of logical abstraction and of the rigour of disciplines and carefully distinguished values is not in the reception of any single work. It is a barren enterprise to take the book as a particular case in any 'conflict of faculties' or divide between traditions. Its motivations and portents are signs of a much wider problem with many positive and negative directions. The problem is best approached through a wider set of symptoms, manifestations and arguments.

Partly because of the way it stretches the meditative form, Massumi's thought demands interpretation. We have become used to great accessibility in philosophical meditations and, more widely, in literary autobiography or other shorter confessional forms. They work with common language and with the appearance of a 'degree zero' of style such that everyone can feel invited to follow and think alongside the meditator. This is not the case for Semblance and Event. Instead, we are given esoteric meditation, with all the attendant risks and felicities of esotericism. The esoteric style, with its emphasis on doctrine and secrecy, seems out of step with meditation as an inclusive open-hearted form. Massumi manages to bond the two through a distinction between syntactical style and vocabulary.

His phraseology is elegant, simple and enticingly set in motion through a discrete counter-point of puzzles and partial answers. From chapter to chapter, we follow a good story-teller, a patient interviewee and simple, companionable, inner and outer voices. Descriptive passages are accurate and direct. Long and short sentences, well-balanced clauses, patterns of questions and responses, carefully chosen examples and apposite quoted passages succeed one another with ease and good timing. Yet this syntax carries fearsome words, difficult neologisms, out-of-place technical terms, didactic distinctions between distant terms and complex propositions presented as fact. There is a kind of conjuror's art to this strange juxtaposition of a bright everyday -- portrayed elegantly -- but pierced by the uncanny. Massumi's writing combines the delight of an attractive scene made magical and the unease of the familiar rendered unreliable.

We can see this alloy of esotericism and accessibility early on in the book when Massumi begins to introduce us to one of its principal concepts: the event. He is reflecting on process philosophy of art, where art and philosophy become a joint activity through shared occurrence, or joint event-hood. Philosophy thereby loses its abstraction and external critical viewpoint. It gains a more direct involvement in artistic creation and sensibility. This activity is underpinned conceptually by a shift from objects to events:

The reality of the world exceeds that of objects, for the simple reason that where objects are, there has also been their becoming. And where becoming has been, there is already more to come. The being of an object is an abstraction from its becoming. The world is not a grab-bag of things. It is an always-in-germ. To perceive the world in an object frame is to neglect the wider range of its germinal reality. (6)

The clauses and propositions slip along one another easily. Each claim is digestible yet set in an economical form which expands with musical repetitions and echoes. There is a satisfying rhetoric reminiscent of early sophistry. It is too easy to pass from premise to conclusion when encouraged by a 'simple reason'. Claims depend on stark and familiar use of the copula. A thing 'is' or 'is not', in various attempts at clear extensive or intensive definition.

Things are not as they seem, though. Nor should they be given the demanding and innovative art and philosophy events to follow in the book. It turns out that the reason given by Massumi is not simple at all, because it depends on a sleight of hand around uses of tense. The copula is mistreated badly; torn from its bearings in space and time. What has been is still. This has been is becoming. 'To be' is the main verb in each of Massumi's sentences, but then one claims being as an abstraction from becoming thereby calling itself and others into a web of paradoxes. The 'is' of 'to be' is 'becoming'. Negation and neglect also work in familiar ways, but then the negation of negation and the neglected thing turn out to be very strange wisps indeed: the 'always in germ' and 'germinal reality'.

Should we be impatient or damning in response to these contradictions and this evasiveness? No. Massumi is giving us an alternative line of thought which defines existence as event and event as complex and multiple becoming. He has chosen a mode of presentation that communicates this as straightforwardly as possible, but with risks of paradoxical conjunctions such as a rich descriptive language based in the present that describes events that cannot be simply present or simply located at a particular space-time.

Very few philosophers have done this as thoroughly and with such tenacious commitment to the ubiquity of becoming and event. The title of the book is therefore accurate. Massumi is giving us an aesthetics of events that leads to an emphasis on the role of semblance in things as counter to events. Events and the desire for semblance are in tension with one another. He is therefore pushed to use somewhat barbaric terms such as 'always in germ' and 'germinal reality' to indicate how anything is really an ongoing genesis driven from the past and towards the future. Nothing really 'is'. It is really only a semblance that we only enter into contact with through mutual genetic interaction. We interact through processes of genesis. Philosophy therefore has to become activist and part of the action in order to come into vital contact with the event. This explains the deep objection to detachment and abstraction as fundamental philosophical tools.

Instead of abstraction Massumi seeks immersion. This explains the second original side to his book. It immerses philosophy through a virtual extension of settled sensation and, more precisely, through the power of art-events to bring disorder to thought and bodily order through virtual effects beyond the boundaries of familiar experience. This is why he focuses on the occurrent arts, that is, on artistic events and events in art. Many of these occurrent forms are quite obviously event-like and involve now familiar techniques of installation and sensory manipulation. This leads to an opposition to representation in art and to claims mapping art to real experiences of actual things.

Massumi develops a critique of perspective in landscapes because formal order is imposed on the virtual potential of non-sensuous events, that is, events where perception and sensibility are set in motion through affective and bodily movements which break subject-object relations. A possible objection comes out here, since it is far from obvious that a landscape by Claude does not have virtual powers in pretty much the same way as the less representational works it inspired in, say, Turner. Indeed, Claude's works were events for Turner. The event is a contact and a transformation. It does not therefore depend on what does or does not transform something else, but rather whether there is or is not transformation in any given case. So though it makes sense to associate events with motion, it is a mistake to associate them with the extent, purity or intensity of motion. Something has to be moved, but kinds and scales of motion are not set before the event.

We might well call Claude representational because of the formal order of his work. We'd be very wrong to conclude that his art cannot be event-like in the same way as contemporary dance by Cunningham, as championed by Massumi. When he lauds Cunningham because he 'disables metaphor and cuts communication' (138), Massumi gives us clues to an objection to his association of event with virtual effects beyond the boundaries of formal order, because these effects work through what they disable. If a maelstrom of sensory disruption is our everyday state, it will be hard to experience the kinds of disorientation and movement Massumi seeks in art events. There will be no space for the non-sensory because all will be non-sensory.

Events require order. They work in relative ways between different states of order, jumping between them thanks -- it is true -- to disruptive sensory effects. There can be an imperceptible yet immensely disruptive virtual effect in apparently the most ordered and safe forms of experience. Indeed, the greater the order perhaps the greater the effect, when it finally comes. For instance, imagine a represented and familiar scene where all that is missing is the sign for a departed loved-one. A missing glove or pair of glasses amidst formal order could be the most moving and terrible event. How then are we to decide between semblance and event? Movement can become a fetish for process philosophy of art such that we forget the ordered conditions for the deep effects of that movement.

We can see movement becoming fetish in Massumi's sensitive discussion of the painter and installation artist Robert Irwin. At first, Massumi traces Irwin's careful and tentative passages away from vision given form by a well-ordered outside world. Then, though, each passage is subsumed into a progression to a final extreme state where movement and event explode out: 'Composing-away. Irwin carried his work through a "succession of reductions" leading all the way to ground zero". Ground zero was a detonation site.' (159) It is not surprising that Irwin describes such a progression. Artists tend to view their latest work as best and as a fulfillment of early work. It is a matter of survival and presentational narrative, if nothing else. The philosopher should not be so easily led towards a final extreme point, because each of the earlier passages was such a point and because the latest field of detonation will fade too and take its place in another sequence.

Massumi might answer that his definitions of events allow for this resting with each stage rather than with an extreme. This is hard to justify, though, because his account of mutual transformation, of conjoined events, depends on an extreme account of the non-sensual as break and irruption of the pure. It also depends on a dialectic which moves away from 'beautiful semblance', drawn partly from Benjamin, and towards 'non-sensuous' composition or co-movement. I have no doubt that some events are captured well as the heading of this dialectic and as non-sensual in that way. Here is Massumi's description of one such in the work of Irwin:

The effect takes some time to set in. It nags at you. You think you feel a little disoriented, a tad dizzy perhaps. You feel something niggling, like a stirring on the periphery of vision itching for you to turn your attention to it. But attend as you might, you find nothing to look at. Then it happens. Bam! The scrim suddenly jumps into sight. It's less that you looked at it, than it jumped out at you. It suddenly appeared out of nowhere: out of the self-activity of vision. (164)

It is worth noting the method of suggestion at work in this passage. Massumi feels and 'you' do not. This is significant because it points to the risk of a surreptitious assumption about the effects in given events and, more seriously, about the types of events associated with scales and types of non-sensual effects, where the virtual encroaches on some prior well-ordered real. Not every event is 'Bam!' Some are 'whisper', 'drip', 'wait', 'nothing', 'brush'. Each one of these is singular and not common. They gain their force, not from a position on a procession to the great events of rupture and disorientation, but from change with no need for a violent work of non-sensuous virtual effects.

However, even if correct, these qualms about direction and absolutes take nothing away from the deep value of Massumi's book, which does not lie in any final conclusions, claims or position. Semblance and Event is not about such conclusions but rather about a sensual and intellectual communication of events and processes. His meditations on art will inspire and reward not only philosophers curious about the aesthetic promise of process philosophy, but also artists and many other practitioners as they seek inspiration from the philosophy of events as co-creation.