Seneca and the Idea of Tragedy

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Gregory A. Staley, Seneca and the Idea of Tragedy, Oxford UP, 2010, 185pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195387438.

Reviewed by James Ker, University of Pennsylvania



That Seneca the Younger wrote both tragedies and prose works dealing with Stoic philosophy has long provoked the question in what sense, if at all, the tragedies are Stoic or philosophical. Gregory Staley scrutinizes some of the existing answers to this question and offers a new answer of his own (tragedy as “image”) that is partly informed by Seneca’s influence on how tragic theory was articulated during the English renaissance. This concise and incisive book mines Seneca’s writings, both the tragedies and the prose, for hints concerning Seneca’s views on the function of tragedy and also reviews ancient and early modern theoretical discussions of tragedy that can help us to fill in the missing details of Seneca’s approach. The “idea” of the title is a term borrowed from Seneca’s prose writings by the sixteenth-century English theorist Sir Philip Sidney, and refers to the “fore-conceit” which the artist has in mind when he creates; Sidney incorporates this into a theory of tragedy heavily influenced by Aristotle, which makes explicit, Staley argues, the theory that is implicit in Seneca. The volume will be useful for anyone interested in the relationship between philosophy and tragedy, both ancient and modern.

From late antiquity until the early seventeenth century, the Seneca of the tragedies was generally thought to be a different person from the Seneca of the prose works, a bifurcation due not only to misunderstood evidence (Martial’s poem referring to “two Senecas”, meaning actually Seneca the Elder, the collector of declamations, and Seneca the Younger, author of tragedies and philosophical prose; Epigrams 1.61) but also to the fact that the two types of writing make strange bedfellows. The tragedies, on the one hand, restage Greek myths with a focus on the violent emotions of the protagonist and their resonances in a chaotic and irrational world. In the prose works, on the other hand, Seneca adopts the role of moral advisor, leading his addressees toward the perfection of rationality in their moral lives, both in owning the role ascribed to them by a providential cosmos and in combatting passions such as anger.

The contrast is further complicated by Seneca’s public career, from his banishment by the emperor Claudius to his forced suicide under Nero. Some of the prose works have a clear and identifiable place within Seneca’s biography, but the tragedies also evoke the nature of the age in their own way — a fact registered by the author of the Octavia. This play written in a Senecan mode sometime in the generation after Seneca’s death (touched on only briefly in this volume, 124-25) dramatizes the crisis of Neronian politics, including Seneca’s own disempowerment. Over the last century, as Seneca’s tragedies and philosophical writings have been reevaluated after a period of neglect and even scorn in the nineteenth century, scholars have made different proposals concerning how we might understand these bodies of writing as the work of the same author.

One approach has been to decouple the tragedies and the philosophy as two distinct and coordinate branches of Seneca’s authorial production without any necessary interrelationship or hierarchy. Another has been to see the tragedies as in some way undermining, deliberately or unconsciously, the Stoic art of living, whether by revealing negative forces more powerful (perhaps even, in some sense, more “philosophical”) than philosophy’s doctrines or by showing philosophy’s own flaws or limit cases. Both of the options just outlined have much to commend them, and some of the most exciting recent work on the tragedies has been in this area. Among those, in turn, who see Seneca writing “Stoic” tragedy, a number of options have been explored. The most obvious and still popular option has been to see the tragedies as using tragic literary form to accomplish certain goals of Stoic ethics, with the audience being morally improved, or provoked in productive ways, through various specific effects of watching the tragedies (or hearing them recited). Another path, however, was taken by Thomas Rosenmeyer, whose Senecan Drama and Stoic Cosmology (Berkeley, 1982) argued that the Stoic element of Seneca’s tragic world was less its ethics than its physics: traditional tragic plots unfold in a world defined by the causation of body on body and by the dynamics of cosmic sumpatheia.

Staley offers his own alternative to the moral goal: his claim, in brief, is that Senecan tragedy, to the extent that it is Stoic, is an exercise in Stoic epistemology. He presents Seneca the tragedian as pursuing his own goal stated in the dialogue De Ira, of giving a “naked” image of the angry soul: "Let us picture (figuremus) anger … like the hellish monsters (monstra) poets create" (Ira 2.35.5; quoted 65). As Staley argues, “The key to Senecan drama lies not in the ‘word’ as T. S. Eliot once described it, but in the ‘image,’ which … constitutes an ‘image of the truth’” (7). But although the notion of “image” has important Stoic foundations, Staley sees Seneca’s focus on tragedy as image, mimesis, recognition, etc. as deriving ultimately from Aristotle. Seneca departs from Aristotle only in the emphasis he places upon tragedy as “a visual and horrific revelation of the truth” (113), which gives greater emphasis to Aristotle’s dramatic category of opsis (“visual representation”).

In the Introduction Staley contrasts Plato’s antipathy toward poets with Aristotle’s philosophical defense of poetry, and especially tragedy. His goal, he explains, is to locate Seneca within this Aristotelian tradition and to explore not the already well-studied influence of Seneca on Renaissance tragedy, but “instead Seneca’s influence on the Renaissance’s theory of tragedy, which is what I mean by the ‘idea’ of tragedy” (5). The notion of “idea” does important labor for Staley in Chapter 1, “Theorizing Tragedy,” albeit with some varying senses that the reader may find revealing but also somewhat slippery. The term is used to capture the fact that Seneca had a theoretical “idea” (i.e., theory) about what he was doing when he wrote tragedies, but also, evidently, to define the mimetic function of the tragedies themselves. Seneca, guided by a Stoic tradition influenced by Aristotle, sought to offer “a vivid image of the human soul” (23), or what Sidney, in his Apology for Poetry (1595), explicates as “a perfect picture” whose vividness makes it more compelling than either philosophical abstraction or historical fact.

At the end of the chapter, Staley begins a polemical thread that will continue throughout the book, taking to task modern scholars who see Seneca as exploiting the “moral dangers inherent in tragedy” (21) to unsettle the audience, such as through their vicarious enjoyment of violent emotions, or through the recognition of poetry as a powerful and irrational force. In general, Staley sees some recent readings as overly committed to the idea that the tragedies are commenting on poetry itself or are revealing the poet’s unconscious. This criticism is highly effective for Staley as a method for clarifying his own claims, though the reader will want to evaluate the other scholarship independently. For example, the books by Alessandro Schiesaro (The Passions in Play: Thyestes and the Dynamics of Senecan Drama (Cambridge, 2003)) and Cedric Littlewood (Self-representation and Illusion in Senecan Tragedy (Oxford, 2004)), throw light on Seneca’s tragic poetics in areas that Staley’s book does not touch upon, and will strike some readers as more comprehensive accounts of what Seneca is doing with tragedy as a literary form.

In the chapters that follow, Staley scrutinizes rival explanations more closely and fleshes out his own account. Chapter 2, “The Very Ends of Poesy,” sets out and critiques the various reasons that might be offered for Seneca’s writing tragedy: the notion of Seneca as a moralist teaching through tragedy (for example, in an allegorical mode), as an aristocrat writing tragedy as a leisure activity, and as a Platonist experimenting in the sublime, manic, or playful aspects of poetic activity. His analysis of Seneca’s own conceptions of “lighter studies” (leviora studia) and of the sublime are particularly detailed, and the chapter is helpful overall in identifying the ways in which ancient characterizations of the status and function of poetry do not necessarily apply to tragedy.

In Chapter 3, “A Just and Lively Image,” Staley goes into greater depth on what he sees as the primarily epistemological function of the tragedies. Acknowledging that earlier readers of Seneca from Sidney to the present time have drawn attention to “Senecan tragedy’s function as image, as dramatic realisation of human psychology, behaviour, experience” (A. J. Boyle, quoted 55), he probes its philosophical underpinnings in the Stoic concept of the “image” (phantasia) that allows “comprehension” (katalepsis), and also in the rhetorical technique of “vivid description” (enargeia, whose always complicated relationship to energeia is here explicated clearly).

The content of tragedy’s image is the focus of Chapter 4, “The Soul of Tragedy.” Staley essentially helps us to see how Epictetus’ definition of tragedy as “the presentation in verse of the passions of humans who have admired external things” (Disc. 1.4.26-27) is exactly relevant to Seneca. The chapter begins from the basic and uncontroversial suggestion that Seneca draws upon the Stoic tradition of “turning to poetry for its vivid incarnations of the human soul” (70), and then uses a penetrating and informative exploration of the notion of catharsis to specify exactly in what way Seneca may have imagined his tragedies affecting the emotions of the viewer (preference is given to Aristotle’s notion of catharsis producing “clarification” in the mind of the reader; cf. 8). Staley temporarily blurs the distinction between what the audience feels and what they see taking place on stage in the mind of the protagonist (esp. 80-81), but the outcome of his discussion is clear: in Senecan tragedy the audience sees a process of judgment taking place, moving through the Stoic epistemological stages of impression, judgment, and passion, and “the souls of tragedy’s audiences replicate in their responses the same process of judgment with the potential for a different conclusion” (95). Staley builds creatively here on Herington’s tripartite structural model of Senecan plot, on Shadi Bartsch’s notion of the “mirror of the self,” and most of all on the parallels between tragedy and trial (including Seneca’s father’s specialty, declamation) as emplotments of evidence, persuasion, and judgment.

The culmination of Staley’s theory comes in Chapter 5, “Reading Monsters,” which is more forthcoming about the images of the soul presented in the tragedies, identifying these with monstra, a term denoting the prodigious “monsters” of myth and divination, but also associated (through Roman popular etymology) with demonstration and admonition. Seneca, Staley argues, builds upon Virgil’s invocation of infernal deities in the Aeneid to give concrete representations of the irrational soul (an argument nicely developed from the 1995 essay by Michael Putnam, "Virgil’s Tragic Future: Senecan Drama and the Aeneid"). This, in turn, has a number of implications: an aesthetics of the grotesque (which could have been extended, however, with the help of Bartsch’s Ideology in Cold Blood: A Reading of Lucan’s Civil War (Cambridge, Mass., 1998), ch. 1); an audience perspective shaped by Roman divination (especially the practice of extispicium, examination of entrails); a tragic poetics of the body; and a questioning of the power of civilization (unraveling the conclusion of the Aeneid, which Staley nicely traces through Seneca’s letters 90 and 91; 118). These are significant concepts, and it would have been useful to see some of them developed in greater detail here, perhaps in an additional chapter.

In the volume’s Conclusion, however, Staley shifts in a different direction by seeking to subsume within Seneca’s idea of tragedy not only the tragedies themselves, but also his life. Reviewing Seneca’s own death scene, as well as the death scene of Sidney through the account of his biographer Fulke Greville, Staley argues that both the tragedies and the life fall under a superordinate category of “Senecan tragedy” which “offers ‘images’” (128), but that whereas the tragedies offer images of lives lived badly, “In his death Seneca tried to rewrite poetry as philosophy by creating the truest tragedy” (128). Seneca’s notion of “a perfect tragedy,” ascribed to him by Joseph Addison (1672-1719), takes its inspiration not from the tragedies, but from the deaths of Socrates and Cato, and from Seneca’s own De Providentia, as did Addison’s own Cato play (123).

In case this review gives the impression that Staley’s discussion is purely theoretical, it is worth emphasizing that his illustrations from the plays themselves are concise but effective. For example, he usefully shows the ways in which Seneca’s tragedies incorporate the Aristotelian language of “recognition” (Lat. agnoscere) in ways that had never occurred in Greek tragedy (93). Later he devotes two pages to the figure of Tiresias in Seneca’s Oedipus, using him to illustrate the “monsters” theory. Seeking to divert recent characterizations of Tiresias as a metapoetic figure, Staley argues instead that he is an analogue for “the analyst examining the soul for signs that can be interpreted” (105) and that the mutiplication of methods, as he exhausts one divinatory procedure after another, is in keeping with the imperative used by Seneca in his analytical mode in the De Ira: anger’s “evils must be examined and dragged out into the open” (Ira 3.5.3; 106). Only by doing this can the play fully explicate the evil and enigmatic state of Oedipus’ soul — although the difference between the inadvertent crimes of Oedipus and the conscious violence of other Senecan protagonists could perhaps have been explored with advantage.

A few additional observations can be made about the precision of the argument and its presentation. Although the focus on the epistemology of the tragedies is refreshing and instructive, at times the emphasis on form rather than content seems to be more like a useful thought experiment than a final explanation. Staley’s own account, for example, seems to presuppose that the images of the soul seen by the audience will result in a particular kind of response; although the focus may be on epistemological processes, such as the exercise of judgment in response to representations, surely this is also didactic in some sense. At one point he retracts the idea that the tragedies have a “warning” function (70), yet such a function would seem to be inherent in his account of monstra and admonition; and the notions of persuasion and dissuasion that are central to his account of the tragedies’ quasi-forensic function would seem to be goal-directed.

Some clarification could also have helped on the interesting aetiological goals which Staley more than once ascribes to Seneca. For example, the suggestions that “Seneca’s goal is not so much to illustrate anger as to explain the political and historical world in which he lived” (72), and that “As a Roman, Seneca turned to tragedy to represent wicked kings; as a Stoic, he turned to psychology to explain their insanity” (72), both seem somewhat at odds with the tenor of the argument toward vivid representation without a specific teaching goal. The reader will also want to be careful in interpreting Seneca’s phrase hic humanae vitae mimus (“this mime that is human life,” Ep. 80.7), a metaphoric comparison of life with a dramatic spectacle which Seneca illustrates through the example of kings on stage played by actors who are in fact mere slaves, encapsulated in the notion of personata felicitas (happiness that is staged, superficial, a product of theatrical masks). Staley repeatedly gives the impression that this phrase alludes to tragedy as an “image of human life” (54, cf. 123, 136), which blurs Seneca’s language. A few typographic errors or inconsistencies slipped through the net (for example, tranfigurari for transfigurari, 33; ‘effected’ for ‘affected,’ 35; enthusiastikon for enthousiastikon, 42; ‘Curiatus’ for ‘Curiatius,’ 87), but these do not detract from what is in all other respects a finely produced book and a great pleasure to read.

At its best, this book does valuable service to readers of Seneca’s tragedies and prose works. It also offers a number of stimulating points of departure for further exploration of where Seneca fits into larger narratives regarding the ancient philosophical schools’ literary theories, the cultural functions of Latin literature, and the reception of classical literature in the English Renaissance. Most importantly, it will be easy to turn from this book back to Seneca’s tragedies, and to find one’s “epistemology” of Seneca’s tragic images enhanced.