Seneca and the Self

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Shadi Bartsch and David Wray (eds.), Seneca and the Self, Cambridge UP, 2009, 304 pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780521888387

Reviewed by Katja Maria Vogt, Columbia University



Seneca and the Self, edited by Shadi Bartsch and David Wray, is a collection of twelve essays on the self in Seneca’s philosophical and literary oeuvre. Not all contributors, however, agree that there is such a thing as ‘the self’ in Seneca’s thought. This makes for a rather special set-up: the very subject-matter of the volume may not exist.

Before I turn to the individual contributions to the volume, a few words on what is at issue when scholars discuss Seneca and the self. Scholarship on Seneca has been greatly influenced by Foucault, who reconstructs Hellenistic philosophy in a way that many find inspiring. According to Foucault, the Delphic inscription gnôthi sauton — interpreted as calling for self-knowledge — receives a reinterpretation in Seneca. It now involves the claim that the self, envisaged almost as an interlocutor, needs to be taken care of. The self here is not the self of early modern philosophy, about which Foucault has philosophical reservations. Foucault thinks that today we are interested in a different self, one that he takes to be intersubjective, partly obscure to us, and sometimes better known to our friends than to ourselves. Foucault suggests that Seneca explores this interlocutor self: a self that may need therapy from partially unconscious desires and that seeks to understand itself within social and political contexts.

To some, Foucault’s reading of Seneca is first and foremost a part of his philosophy, rather than a compelling interpretation of Seneca. Readers who take this perspective might insist that Seneca, like other Stoic philosophers before him, talks about the rational soul, not the self. They might not even be on board with Foucault’s intuition about the kind of self we today are interested in; their reservations toward modern notions of the self might go so far that ‘the self’ is not part of their conceptual framework. Others might think that, surely, each of us is interested in our ‘self,’ whatever precisely that is. To them, insistence on the difference between the concepts of ‘self’ and ‘soul’ may appear pedantic, insufficiently open to the project of thinking through Seneca with Foucault’s philosophy at one’s side, and perhaps even misguided insofar as ‘soul’ is no longer part of our philosophical vocabulary. In their introduction, Bartsch and Wray admit that there is no "technically articulated concept of selfhood in Seneca’s writing." For them, this raises the question whether one should hesitate to do what they do, namely "posit a web of relations at the center of which there finally emerges a distinctively Senecan self" (7). In what follows, I shall sketch how each author contributes to this enterprise, and will conclude with a thought about Foucault’s role as inspirer of ancient studies, which seems to me not entirely unlike Hegel’s role.

The volume begins with A.A. Long’s essay "Seneca on the Self: Why Now?" For Long, "self" is a "name for one’s individual and temporal identity." This identity is constituted by such facts about oneself as age, ethnicity, gender, parenthood; it is also the center of agency, intentionality, beliefs, and so on (26). Long thus rephrases the traditional topic of Stoic philosophy — that of human agents who try to lead a good life — in terms of selfhood. According to the Stoics, human beings should see themselves as what they are: interconnected parts of a natural world, parts with properties such as age, roles such as being a parent, and a rational soul that is the locus of thought and the source of agency. For Long, this translates into different kinds of selves. A human being has an objective self, constituted by her properties and roles, an occurrent subjective self, namely her particular present thoughts and emotions, and a normative self, which is what her subjective self should be (26-7). This distinction offers an illuminating interpretive tool for the dynamics in Seneca’s Letters, one that several contributors refer to.

Brad Inwood sees neither a novel ontology nor a novel moral psychology in Seneca that would justify the claim that Seneca envisages a ‘self’ rather than a rational soul. Inwood grants a point that Foucault-inspired interpreters make: reflexive pronouns are rather frequent in Seneca’s texts. For Inwood, however, this does not indicate engagement with the self. Inwood observes that Seneca is much concerned with himself throughout his writings. It is important to Seneca to assert himself as an independent Roman philosopher — hence the title of Inwood’s article, "Seneca and Self-assertion." Seneca also likes to use himself (or his authorial persona) as a moral exemplum. Contrary to the Foucaultian claim that Seneca advocates a spiritual turn towards the self and ascetic practices of self-examination, Inwood emphasizes that Seneca argues for a delicate balance between retreat and publicity. Seneca is much preoccupied with the effects that a political career has on one’s peace of mind. His advice is not to turn inside, in order to live a non-public life of therapeutic exercises. His advice is to use the public and the private as cures for each other (On Tranquility 17.3). It is greatly to the credit of Bartsch and Wray that they invited this contribution; Inwood’s position raises rather fundamental questions about the very project of studying Seneca’s conception of selfhood.

Christopher Gill’s "Seneca and Selfhood" engages, in part through a subtle analysis of the tragic characters Medea and Phaedra, with disintegration and integration of the self. Self-integration, Gill argues, is a process that includes what the Stoics call oikeiôsis (literally ‘affiliation’). Gill hints at an ambitious and compelling way to spell this out (81): self-integration may ultimately involve appreciation of the way in which one is affiliated with literally everything in the world outside one’s mind (one’s body, other human beings, nature). Gill argues against ascribing a notion of selfhood to Seneca that involves what he sees as the hallmarks of Cartesian and post-Cartesian philosophy: self-consciousness, subjectivity, and individuality. He says that Seneca employs and develops a "thoroughly objectivist framework of thinking about psychological and ethical life and about their interrelationship" (78). However, the distinction between objectivity and subjectivity is itself a construct developed in Cartesian and post-Cartesian philosophy. If one holds, in substance, similar views to Gill’s, one might not want to employ the category of the objective in characterizing Seneca’s thought.

Martha Nussbaum’s "Stoic Laughter: Seneca’s Apocolocyntosis" is a surprising contribution to the volume. The word ‘self’ is not mentioned once, and nothing in Nussbaum’s paper touches on the question of whether Seneca conceptualizes something like selfhood. Nussbaum credits Seneca with writing a funny piece, the Apocolocyntosis, about the death of Claudius, who pays in the underworld for his horrific deeds as emperor. The laughter that Nussbaum finds in this work is dark, filled with anger and disgust, and thus seemingly incompatible with Stoic views on the emotions. With the help of an interesting survey of kinds of laughter in ancient writings, Nussbaum aims to find a place for this spiteful laughter in Seneca’s Stoicism. As she sees it, disgust for Claudius involves a Stoic devaluation of external goods. With a view to the topic of Seneca and the Self, Nussbaum’s paper might in effect strengthen the kind of perspective that Inwood suggests. Nussbaum does not aim to find a self in Seneca. Instead, she focuses on a core aspect of Seneca’s psychology, namely the analysis of negative emotions.

In her contribution "Seneca on Fortune and the Kingdom of God," Elizabeth Asmis explores Seneca’s reinterpretation of the Stoic notion of fate. The Stoics identify fate and god, and Seneca is orthodox in accepting this view. However, Seneca shifts focus. As Asmis convincingly shows, Seneca looks at fate through the eyes of the human agent who is shaken by events: fate becomes fortune; the virtuous person proves herself by battling fortune as well as she can. Seneca’s hero, then, is someone who excels in the ability to deal with adversity. Asmis speaks of an internal kingdom of the human mind (121), antithetical to the kingdom of fortune. To conquer fortune is to be virtuous, and that is, to have one’s soul in the best possible state. Asmis once calls the mind the "kingdom of the self" (122), thereby indicating where she sees the connection of her topic to the topic of the volume.

Catherine Edwards discusses Seneca’s metaphors of freedom and slavery in her paper "Free Yourself! Slavery, Freedom and the Self in Seneca’s Letters." According to a well-known Stoic thesis, the virtuous person is free and the vicious person a slave. In the eyes of some interpreters, Seneca’s variations on this theme imply a criticism of the social institution of slavery: the slave in the ordinary sense can merit the praise of being genuinely free, and the person who is free in the ordinary sense may justly be described as a slave. Edwards argues that this positive assessment of Seneca as critic of slavery is misguided. If, for Seneca, real-life slaves can be free in the most relevant sense of freedom, they apparently can just as well remain slaves in the ordinary sense, and serve their masters — including Seneca, who cannot see himself survive without slaves. This reading rings true, and it contributes an interesting idea to the topic of the volume: for Seneca, slaves are part of the master’s identity (156). Edwards does not call into question whether her study is indeed best described as engaging with ‘the self.’ For example, her translation of Seneca’s vindica te tibi! — "Lay claim to yourself for yourself" — simply accepts the way in which, as an artifact of the English language, "selves" come into play (a German translation would say "Nimm dich in deinen Besitz"; the difference between te and te ipso might be worth preserving.) But Edwards’s focus on self-possession and its legal ramifications is intriguing. Indeed, it may appear that antecedents of modern conceptions of selfhood might develop in the context of the notion of a person, as it figures in Roman law.

James Ker’s "Seneca on Self-examination: On Anger 3.36" addresses a text crucial to Foucault. Seneca gives a vivid image of a routine he recommends: to think through one’s day, actions, and attitudes before going to sleep, not chastising oneself, but getting clear about the things one could do better (On Anger 3.36). Ker follows Foucault and sees Seneca engage in what he thinks of as a ‘technology’ of the self. To Ker, the paraphrase I offered would likely appear insensitive to Seneca’s figurative language, culpably lacking any reference to the self. Ker’s reading is "intended to counteract the impulse to strip the figurative language from Seneca’s prose-writing in order to search for a putative philosophical doctrine that can exist intact without it" (186), an impulse that Ker ascribes to Inwood. This is a surprisingly harsh charge against Inwood, whose (2007) translation of Seneca’s Letters is extraordinarily nuanced — an accomplishment that is arguably impossible for those unresponsive to Seneca’s figurative language. In a way that almost seems to mock any attempt to be clear about crucial concepts, Ker writes that Inwood’s "approach is useful for revealing Seneca to be a more orthodox Stoic than he may at first have appeared, i.e., in having a monistic model of the self" (178, my emphasis). Surely, if Ker wanted to do justice to Inwood or to orthodox Stoic theory, he should have said "rational soul," not "self." Ker’s analysis of On Anger 3.36 is worth reading for its detail. But sentences like the one I just mentioned make one wonder whether Ker is genuinely interested in clarifying what is related to what in the relations he calls "self-relations."

Bartsch argues in "Senecan Metaphor and Stoic Self-instruction" that Seneca’s metaphors are "the most striking aspect of his teaching" (213). Bartsch ascribes two basic roles to metaphor: to help us arrive at a correct view of what something ‘really’ is (a dish of fish is really a corpse of a fish), and to help us ‘translate’ something, so that we see it as something else (our dead child was merely a loan, which now we have given back). But one might think, and the Stoics would agree, that a dish of fish really is a dish of fish, not the corpse of a fish. Consider the difference between a nicely prepared meal and a dead fish washed to the shores — a good meal is, for the Stoics, valuable and to be preferred; on this point, Marcus Aurelius, to whom Bartsch appeals, is neither in agreement with earlier Greek Stoic doctrine nor with Seneca. Moreover, Bartsch’s analysis of what she calls the "correct propositional content about impressions" (197) is somewhat confusing: neither is it clear that the linguistic counterparts to rational impressions, lekta, are aptly understood as propositions; nor is it clear that they are about impressions. The Stoics think that we need correct or, in their terms, cognitive, impressions of the world. When we utter a statement, we are assenting to a cognitive impression and we assert its linguistic counterpart; the relationship between impressions and their linguistic counterparts is not one for which there are any correctness conditions. Bartsch explores three metaphors: the self as inner space, the self as commodity, and the self as something we shape in the manner of an artist. Though it is unclear why she does not rephrase things in the terms that Seneca uses in passages she cites — namely in terms of shaping the soul, rather than the self — Bartsch offers subtle detail and a passionate defense for heightened attention to Senecan metaphor.

In "Seneca and the Denial of the Self," Alessandro Schiesaro analyses three Senecan protagonists, Medea, Thyestes, and Atreus. He makes a compelling suggestion: Medea’s cause is one of reversing time and undoing the events that led to her present outrage. No longer Jason’s wife, no longer a mother, she becomes, in Seneca’s words, Medea — "now I am ‘Medea’ (Medea nunc sum, 910)." As Schiesaro argues, Seneca is concerned with a phenomenon that Freud explores: that "the unconscious ignores temporality" (231). Medea and Atreus hold on to the past and are motivated in ways that preclude progression into the future. If one wanted to deal with them without becoming their victim, it seems, one would have to understand the workings of passion: one would have to know that Atreus shall not change into a good brother and that Medea shall not accept that Jason wants a new wife. Oblivious to such matters, and unable to interpret his own forebodings, Thyestes is, for Schiesaro, a kind of failure. His denial of the "existence of a murkier, passionate self," is ultimately, as Schiesaro puts it, "a denial of the self" (235). Schiesaro suggests that Seneca’s tragedies, as opposed to his prose writings, thus contain a conception of the self that includes the irrational dimensions of the self (221). As intriguing as Schiesaro’s analysis of the tragedies is, it is not clear how this is meant to differ from Seneca’s Stoic philosophy. Indeed, Schiesaro’s essay in a sense illustrates the core of Stoic psychological monism. The ‘irrational,’ for the Stoics, is not outside of reason. Reason itself is, in most of us, irrational. Thyestes should consider his fears as indicative of judgments made, however implicitly, and he should scrutinize these judgments. His fears need to be transformed into caution, or else they shall not successfully guide him away from danger.

Wray’s paper "Seneca and Tragedy’s Reason" is an admirably clear defense of tragedy as a crucial part of Seneca’s thought. Wray is nicely open about the fact that, qua literary critic, he is attracted to the idea that "tragedy’s passion (a species of poetry’s passion) opposes the bland orderliness of philosophy’s reason and tells its secret truth" (244). In spite of this confession, Wray writes with precise attention to Stoic philosophy (perhaps with the exception that Wray seems to think of Stoic psychological monism as rationalism, 237). Wray argues that Seneca’s tragedies add something significant to the prose writings: exempla of how harsh, how cruel, and how wild life is; how deep passions run, and how conflicted people tend to be. The philosopher’s consolations should not be misread as if their author thought naively that life, on the whole, was rather manageable. Wray’s proposal has the potential to make Seneca a more attractive philosopher for philosophers, who often find Seneca boring and admonitory. With greater awareness of the extreme characters in Seneca’s tragedies, one might become more receptive to a powerful side of Seneca’s philosophy. Perhaps such awareness can make the texts seem less edifying, and more of a testament to a struggle for a well-lived life.

The final paper in the volume, Austin Busch’s "Dissolution of the Self in the Senecan Corpus," explores death and the afterlife in Seneca. As Busch argues, Seneca contemplates two options in his philosophical writings: that death is a transition to a blessed afterlife, and alternatively, that death is annihilation. In both cases, death is a liberation for those who are tortured, oppressed, or in similarly drastic situations. Seneca’s tragedies, however, envisage more troubling conceptions of death. Death could be a transition to ever more extreme kinds of suffering. The dead might be disconsolate and resentful, calling for further deaths to provide them with fresh companions in the underworld. And so on. Busch argues convincingly that the tragedies, full of painful perspectives on death, are a kind of "window onto the imagination of Seneca" (282). Consolation is not able to silence these vivid scenarios, scenarios according to which death is by no means liberating. One question, however, remains curiously unasked in Busch’s otherwise subtle analysis. Busch does not ask what aspect or part of us does or does not survive death. He seems to take for granted that this would be the self. But Busch does not say what this self is (the soul, the soul in its human body, the soul in another kind of body, etc.?). Of course, there is a limit to how much can be done in one paper. But since the self is the topic of the volume, one might have hoped for some clarification.

In sum, the volume is worth reading for anyone interested in Seneca. Readers who are not on board with Foucault’s perspective are unlikely to find much about the self or selfhood in the volume. But perhaps this concern might look irrelevant to future generations, similar to the way in which we today appreciate the scholarship on Greek philosophy that Hegel inspired in the 19th century, whether we are Hegelians or not. Like Hegel, Foucault seems to approach antiquity very much within his own philosophical terms and framework. Hegel and Foucault’s engagement with antiquity both seem to be rather ingenious aspects of their philosophy; both inspired waves of high-level ancient scholarship. Hellenistic philosophy was neglected by those who were in the spell of the Hegelian narrative about a decline of ancient thought. The Foucaultian perspective on antiquity resurrects Hellenistic philosophy, perhaps again not for entirely compelling reasons. But arguably, one should value the resulting scholarship independently of what one thinks about Foucault’s picture of antiquity, similar to the way in which we admire many of the 19th century scholars independently of whether we are on board with the Hegelian ideas that contributed to the upsurge of scholarship at the time.

Seneca and the Self may raise such questions about the history of ancient studies. More immediately, the cumulative effect of the essays is a powerful bid for undoing the conception of Seneca-the-philosopher on the one hand, and Seneca-the-tragedian on the other hand. In recent times, scholars have not entertained the once popular idea that there were two thinkers, a philosopher and a poet, both called Seneca. But they have tended to see Seneca’s writings as rather distinct, even to see Seneca’s different voices as a strength. The proposal that emerges in Seneca and the Self is different: Seneca appears as one thinker with one body of thought, expressed in complementary writings. In particular, the last three chapters, which discuss Seneca’s tragedies, make a strong case for this perspective. Schiesaro, Wray, and Busch see Seneca’s poetic writing as crucial to his engagement with questions vital to his philosophy, questions about passion, death, time, and so on. With greater attention to the tragedies, they suggest, one may see Seneca’s outlook as darker, but also as somehow closer to our lives. If we are more acutely aware that Seneca is a thinker preoccupied with severe conflict — with political oppression, excessive desires, and so on — his philosophy might speak to us more forcefully than if we see him as a teacherly advisor.