Sense and Finitude: Encounters at the Limits of Language, Art, and the Political

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Alejandro A. Vallega, Sense and Finitude: Encounters at the Limits of Language, Art, and the Political, SUNY Press, 2009, 205pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438425092.

Reviewed by Thomas P. Brockelman, Le Moyne College



Alejandro Vallega’s new book, Sense and Finitude: Encounters at the Limits of Language, Art, and the Political, is admirable both in its location of finitude as the key positive insight in Heidegger and in its effort, having admitted the cogency of Heidegger’s technology-critique, nonetheless to maintain a certain distance from Heidegger’s univocal understanding of Western History. Vallega’s text also forms a significant contribution to the reception of Heidegger’s Beiträge, his recently translated 1936 text documenting the German thinker’s mapping of a project that, in hindsight, seems to have remained remarkably stable from the mid-1930s until his death in 1976.1

More problematically, Vallega argues for the continuity of Heidegger’s thought from early through late, a task for which the Beiträge is especially handy. While, from my perspective, the chasm of his response to modernity opens between the two periods, there can be little doubt that, in some form, the question of finitude remains a constant for Heidegger. Recognizing this, the initial four chapters of Sense and Finitude use the Contributions to Philosophy to link the analyses of “mood”, “thrownness”, etc., from earlier texts such as Being and Time and the Basic Problems of Phenomenology to the later work with its technology critique and accompanying announcement of the “end of metaphysics”. For Vallega, as was certainly true for Heidegger from 1936 onward, the task of living honestly as mortal human beings — i.e., of living in a fashion that acknowledges the transcience of our experience and lives — demands above all a response to modern technology as “what’s happening” in our world. Of course, what “modern technology” means is best captured by the preferred term from the Beiträge, “machination”, rather than any word implying criticism of technological objects or strategies: what Heidegger, and Vallega, have in mind, is the basic “way of seeing the world” that leads to the development of technologies — a mode of being which increasingly reduces everything to its “potential usefulness” in such a project of control: "the future depends on the urgent production of results and technological implements for shaping and making the future safe and secure through the expansion ad infinitum of rational quantitative productions of meanings and goods" (p. 15).

Vallega’s Heideggerian emphasis upon “safety and security” already suggests why such a transformation of societies in the image of modern technology becomes an urgent problem for philosophers concerned with finitude. That is, the very mainspring of “machination” is an effort to forget a basic insecurity at the foundation of human life. To the extent that such control increasingly becomes the mania of our world, that world distracts from what matters — even though life within it is the only possibility for any authenticity.

The difficulty posed by technology is not simply that it is a distraction, for, as a fundamental pair of glasses through which we perceive and even produce reality, “machination” or “modern technology” distracts us so thoroughly that it actively hides finitude. In Heidegger’s terms, our age corresponds to the “end of metaphysics” or the “completion of nihilism” — when the basic impulse of Western metaphysics to reduce Being to the presence of beings comes to term in subjective representation and a complete repression of Being itself, as that which cannot be so reduced. The task of controlling nature and human nature entirely occupies our time and attention — so thoroughly that what evades such pragmatism seems no longer to concern us. Because of this hijacking of our concerns, our age emerges, as Vallega quotes Heidegger from the Contributions to Philosophy, as “the epoch of the total lack of questioning” (Vallega, p. 13; Contributions, p. 76).

While climbing rather far into the Heideggerian hermeneutic-machine, Vallega does also insist upon a limit beyond which he can’t follow Heidegger. It’s important to note that, according to Vallega, the task of acknowledging finitude in the age of modern machination produces two answers in Heidegger’s work: first, there’s the response that Heidegger articulates most infamously in his late interview with Der Spiegel, “Only a god can save us now.”2 That is, to provide any real hope for change, the emphasis upon a univocal history of the West demands a similarly unified (and miraculous) transformation of its course, the equivalent of divine intervention. This is the side of Heidegger that leads interpreters to accusations of quietism and fatalism.

Secondly, though, Heidegger’s repeated accounts of “machination” and “the essence of modern technology” circle around an immanent possibility for challenging technological domination. Modern technology and the language carrying its dominance both suppress and depend upon something like finitude: the mania to bring everything into representational control by making it conceptually present depends, unacknowledged, upon a temporality (among other things a temporality of language) that defies it. Because of this, Heidegger and Vallega insist that the emergence of a beyond to representation and technological instrumentalization belongs to the essence of technology. But this passage beyond modern technology is just as concrete, particular, transitory and multiple as the other one is unified and unchanging. Here the philosopher is, above all, an interpreter and a figure who can, in her labors, actively struggle with technological hegemony, opening multiple new paths for understanding an otherwise technicized world.

The structure of Sense and Finitude builds off of this tension between two paths to finitude in the technological age, embracing the latter one (the immanent possibility of reclaiming the poetry already in language) while distancing the author from the “fateful” Heidegger. Thus, Vallega’s initial 3 chapters — the first three “meditations” on Heidegger’s Beiträge — not only raise the problem of finitude in relationship to modern technology but also (Meditation 2) demonstrate how the apparently a-temporal domination of the technical always also carries with it an essentially temporal “decomposition” (p. 20), and show how such decay is an essential aspect of language and “mood” (Meditation 3). Following upon these, the fourth and final Meditation in the series, criticizes the other Heidegger, the one for whom “the thought that is coming is always already situated under the one destiny, the destiny of Western thought” (p. 46). Or, to be more precise, Vallega detects in Heidegger a paralyzing ambivalence, one which immobilizes him between, on the one hand, articulating the unity of the technological world’s historical arc and, on the other hand, the “joyful” task of re-temporalizing and multiplying meanings within that world we tend to see only in its unitary presence.

Having, with the 4th Meditation in Sense and Finitude reached the extent of his argument, Vallega reserves the rest of his book for essays engaging in the opening work that he takes to be the valid form of response to modern technology. After a chapter on Charles Scott’s efforts in The Time of Memory to complexify our view of the Greeks, the rest of Sense and Finitude works along two axes. First, there is a part dedicated to the concrete operations of language (with essays on Plato’s Phaedrus, on Celan’s poetry and Gadamer’s interpretation of it and, finally, on the Derrida/Artauld relationship). Then, in the final section Vallega returns to artistic, cultural and political issues to indicate how language’s work can change those fields — here with a fine chapter on Benjamin’s notion of art today but also essays on the transformation of culture by Garcia-Marquez and Fanon and, finally, on Italo Calvino’s inviting notion of a “politics of lightness”.

It’s worth focusing a bit more closely on the Calvino chapter, which also forms the conclusion of Sense and Finitude, for it both summarizes the strategy of the book as a whole and indicates what I take to be problematic about it. Vallega admires Calvino’s literary strategy when faced with increased technological homogenization of culture, a strategy of re-importing the aesthetic playfulness of language. Story-tellers — so Calvino and Vallega — operate in a language-world where they need not claim a “heavy” transparency of meaning, a clarity that would erase the mind’s capacity to draw ever-new connections between ideas or to expand ideas in unanticipated directions.

However, having suggested the idea of a politics that would operate in this key, Vallega then checks himself, suggesting, indeed, that a philosophical text such as his own cannot attain the quality to which Calvino aspires; he admits that “it might be almost impossible to sustain lightness and quickness” when the task is philosophical, a “thinking through” of “the exactness and plurality of words” (p. 167). Indeed, Vallega seems to admit that his own writing — which must frame the problem of modern technology in also presenting its preferred answer to that problem — makes an irreducibly “heavy” impression for all of its virtues. Or, to put it in a slightly different way, isn’t Vallega’s writing (and the writing of all those who follow this later Heideggerian path to finitude) cursed with a kind of self-hatred of the philosopher, an attitude according to which theoretical reflection is itself a burden to be overcome only in a "poiesis" alien to the representational discourse of philosophy?

Sense and Finitude, then, marks its own failure to measure up to “lightness”. Its author admits that he himself has come up short against his aspiration. However, rather than asserting, as does Vallega, that such failure is itself a by-product of finitude, an inevitable price for thought to pay, I would suggest that the conundrum only holds so long as we accept the thesis that Heidegger’s project remains constant before and after the “turn” in 1934-5. Against Vallega’s thesis, which of course itself challenges the “traditional” Heidegger of Richardson, Pöggeler, von Hermann and others,3 I would propose the contemporary argument of Slavoj Žižek, who would have us believe that the appearance of continuity in Heidegger’s work, Heidegger’s continued use of language and categories of finitude from the earlier period, is misleading.

It is misleading because the very meaning of finitude changes in a fatal way after 1934. For Žižek, finitude as it emerges in Heidegger’s earlier texts, from Being and Time through Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, is a specifically modern and radically subjectivist concept. What Žižek means by this can be seen in Being and Time where the analysis of Dasein’s finitude leads inexorably to the theme of an irreducible decision — that of “anticipatory resoluteness” as articulated in section 62. The insight Žižek finds there is a doubling of the merely “existentialist” ideas according to which, as finite, mortal beings, we can never know the truth about our reality. For Žižek, on the contrary, “anticipatory resoluteness” — as an act of decision — is a kind of praxical knowledge of reality, one affirming that the world “is not”, that it has no totality or fixed order. As a knowledge only available in acting, Žižek takes it as radically subjective, as self-consciously produced by the subject precisely in affirming the impossibility that one might discover any normative measure in the world. In other words, a sufficient understanding of the earlier Heidegger requires that we take Being itself to lack truth, to lack another, broader horizon to which one might appeal for the way “things really are”. This means that the ontological horizon doesn’t primarily indicate “something else/more/beyond” beings which organizes them as a whole, but rather the immanent “finitude” of the world itself, a finitude beyond which there is, literally, “nothing” — only Dasein itself in its subjective nullity.4

By way of contrast, the “finitude” of the Beiträge and later texts is an effort to re-ground the human being in a more encompassing order — even when that order is conceived in terms of radical historicity. We are finite, over and against what is — not Being. The inevitable symptom of such a neo-medievalism is the demand to abandon an imagined “hubris” of modern self-assertion in a response to it that emphasizes “letting be” or attunement. That’s why in, for example, “The Question Concerning Technology”, any intervention in the destiny of Being is conceived as a kind of mimesis, a reflection and extension of the poietic structure of Being itself.

Of course, the reason for both Heidegger’s own flight from modernist subjectivism and for later critiques of such a modernist residuum lies in politics, in the politics of Heidegger’s Nazi period. Žižek argues, contra-Habermas and numerous Heidegger critics, that the problem in 1933 was Heidegger’s increasing ambivalence about the modern subject, his subtle retreat from a language of extra-personal and extra-communal “will” to a discourse of "the volk" and its analogue in the isolated individual (See “Why Heidegger”, pp. 230-25). In other words, for Žižek, Heidegger’s failure wasn’t that he went too far in his modernism. Rather, for him Heidegger didn’t go far enough in his subjectivism — to an insubstantial subject and to a collective irreducible to any substantial identity.5

The relevance of the Žižekian argument for Vallega’s Sense and Finitude is simply that it responsibly retrieves a philosophy indebted to Heidegger on finitude from the very “heaviness” that is the inevitable price for a thought claiming to transcend all forms of the modern subject. Žižek’s tack saves Heidegger from himself, from his retreat to a sterile anti-modernism. Such an approach raises two further questions, though, queries toward whose answer I can only gesture here: first, I would defend Vallega’s insistence that we bring together the question of finitude with an examination of the historical present as crisis. What happens to the critique of contemporary social and historical forms implied by this synthesis? What happens to “the question concerning technology” when we keep Heidegger’s valid insight within a subjectivist understanding? As I have argued in my own recent book, Žižek and Heidegger: the question concerning techno-capitalism (Continuum: 2008), the result is actually quite encouraging. Žižek himself turns out to be a more interesting critic of contemporary social forms as outgrowths of fundamental choices belonging to modernity than was Heidegger himself.

The other issue that Vallega’s approach in Sense and Finitude raises for any effort to separate off a radical-modernist Heidegger deals with what I might call the poetic or even (contra-Heidegger’s own usage of the term) aesthetic dimension. While Žižek makes an excellent corrective to Vallega’s (and Heidegger’s) over-reliance on this dimension — to the tendency to reduce possible responses to “machination” to the limits of “poetry” — he is perhaps too successful in expunging the “work of art”, as Heidegger puns it, from the labor of political change. Žižek misses the aesthetic per se, though his work is rich in examples from the arts and cinema. I take Vallega’s insistence upon and sensitivity to art’s “work”, particularly as exemplified in his sensitive interpretations of Paul Celan or of Calvino himself, to be a useful starting place for a dialogue between two inheritances of Heidegger’s legacy in thinking about finitude. It’s in this context that I welcome Sense and Finitude as a valuable contribution to contemporary continental philosophy.

1 Martin Heidegger, Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis), Gesamtausgabe Band 65 (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 1983); Contributions to Philosophy (From Enowning), translated by Parvis Emad and Kenneth Maly (Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana UP, 1999); hereafter, Beiträge or Contributions.

2 The phrase comes from Heidegger’s famous interview with Der Spiegel, first published in 1976 but from 1966. "Nur noch ein Gott kann uns retten“, Der Spiegel, 31 May 1976.

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3 See William J. Richardson, Heidegger: Through Phenomenology to Thought (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1963); Otto Pöggeler, Martin Heidegger’s Path of Thinking, tr. Daniel Magurshak and Sigmund Barber (Atlantic Highlands, New Jersey: Humanities Press International, 1987); Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrman, Die Selbstinterpretation Martin Heideggers (Meisenheim am Glan: A. Hain, 1964).

4 See, “Why Heidegger Made The Right Step In 1933” in The International Journal of Žižek Studies, vol. 1.4, p. 22; hereafter, “Why Heidegger”. See also In Defense of Lost Causes, (London & New York: Verso, 2008), Chapter 3. Additionally, my argument references Žižek’s The Parallax View (Cambridge and London: The MIT Press, 2006); hereafter, Parallax.

5See Parallax p. 285. For a more extended analysis, see my discussion of Žižek on Heidegger’s Nazism in chapter 1 of Heidegger and Žižek.