Sense and Reality: Essays out of Swansea

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John Edelman (ed.), Sense and Reality: Essays out of Swansea, Ontos, 2009, 235pp., $129.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380415.

Reviewed by Andrew Hsu, University of California, Los Angeles


Rush Rhees went to teach at University College, Swansea (now called the University of Swansea) as a temporary assistant lecturer in 1940. He was given a permanent position in 1946 and remained at Swansea for most of the remainder of his life. Although Rhees never accepted advances in rank, he exercised extraordinary influence on the shape of the philosophy department and on the kind of philosophy done there. In his first decade as a permanent member, Rhees brought Peter Winch, J. R. Holland and J. R. Jones into the department. They were joined in later years by Howard Mounce, D. Z. Phillips, Ilham Dilman, and R. W. Beardsmore. Along with Rhees himself, these long serving members of the department are the subjects of Sense and Reality: Essays out of Swansea. The volume consists of eight essays devoted to individual philosophers and a ninth historical account of the Swansea department in the years when Rhees was active. Since the contributors are themselves connected with the Swansea department, the essays are, among other things, a homage to and remembrance of that department in the Rhees era.

The contributors have answered editor John Edelman's call to "take up the work" of their subjects with essays of varying scope and ambition. Some are content to describe the interests and writings of their subjects. Some offer ambitious overviews and re-interpretations of their subject's works. Some provide critical essays on their subject's central ideas. Although uneven, the resulting volume gives a useful impression of the large-scale structure of Swansea philosophy.

Rhees and the others did not call themselves "The Swansea School" and seem not to have welcomed the label, perhaps because it suggests a single creed or doctrine. That there was no doctrinal unanimity at Swansea is demonstrated early in the collection by Walford Gealy's lugubrious essay on Jones. Jones held a view of the self combining elements of Descartes and Hume which Gealy observes, "belong to a very different philosophical world from that which has been inherited from Wittgenstein". But this last phrase also suggests a justification for speaking of a school. Mario von der Ruhr explains in his historical essay how, through Rhees' influence, the Swansea philosophers came to share a framework of sources (above all, Wittgenstein, but also canonical works of literature), themes (ideas about thought and language on the largest scale, for example) as well as style (non-technical) and attitude ("serious").

Sense and Reality shows that the work of Swansea philosophers revolves around two constellations of themes from Rhees' reading of Wittgenstein on language, sense and nonsense. The first clusters around ideas about the particularity of discourse, the second around ideas about the unity of discourse.[1]

The first and better known set of Swansea themes can be traced to Wittgenstein's remark in Philosophical Investigations that "what we call 'sentence' [Satz] and 'language' has not the formal unity that I imagined, but is the family of structures more or less related to one another."[2] Following this suggestion, Swansea philosophers are suspicious of general patterns to which philosophers hold that discourse must conform. Whether a speaker expresses a sense when she utters a sentence, what sense she expresses and what sort of statement she thereby makes all depend, they hold, upon particularities of the context of utterance. Their insistence upon the importance of particularities goes hand in hand with emphasis on the variety or diversity of the types of concepts, meanings and statements in different fields of discourse. Rhees' attitude to linguistic diversity comes across clearly in a letter to Winch quoted by David Cockburn:

When you raise the question, "What are moral statements like?", you seem to be asking what other statements they are like -- how we ought to class them: Are we describing or ejaculating? -- and this seems to me the wrong way to begin. It seems to assume that they must be a special case of some other class of statement. Whereas I want to say, "Never mind that. When and where do you find them? Under what circumstances do you know you have to do with moral statements? And what sort of questions, what sort of problems, what sort of worries and what sort of answers do they call forth?" (18)

This is not to say that Swansea philosophers eschew all generalizations about language. Winch, for example, held a society in which speaking the truth is not the norm to be inconceivable. But, as Lars Hertzberg explains, it was Winch's view that

the phrase "concern with the truth" does not identify a specific type of human striving, but rather indicates a general form that various types of human endeavour may have in common … What it means to "have knowledge of reality" is constituted by the differences it makes whether we know a thing or not. The difference, however, varies with the context of life and the object in question. (26)

So the emphasis tends to fall, in the writing of Winch and the others, on particularity and diversity.

The descriptions that Swansea philosophers offer of individual languages and of differences between languages are not uniformly plausible, but their attention to particulars is frequently enlightening and their insistence on diversity entirely salutary. Their heavy stress on particularity and diversity does, however, lead them into serious problems. Sometimes they dramatize differences between one class of statements and another in ways which suggest that the statements belong to discrete, self-contained language games, absolutely inaccessible to argument, criticism, explanation, justification, objection, persuasion, etc. from without. Fairly or not, this idea is widely associated with the work of the Swansea School, e.g., Winch's writing on the language of primitive peoples and Phillips' work on religious language.

John Whittaker's essay on Beardsmore demonstrates that the association is not groundless. Beardsmore observes that some believers speak of gratitude for life in the midst of extreme suffering while others find no gratitude in their hearts and are prompted to expressions of bitterness. He says that these people place different values on life and differ about the criteria for its goodness. As a result, what they recognize as reasons for thought, feeling and action diverge so fundamentally that their disagreement is not amenable to argument:

The difficulty arises when our values are our criteria for moral judgement and we differ in our understanding of what these values are. Whenever there are such differences in value, they affect what we consider good moral reasons to be; and thus it is difficult to see what sense there is in relying on the usual model of rational justification to resolve disagreements that result. (198)

"The usual model of rational justification" seems to point towards rational justifications that do not fit the usual model, but that is not where Beardsmore turns. According to Whittaker, Beardsmore's point is that

both reactions are natural in the sense that neither arises out of any sort of thought or reflection, and neither follows from any indispensable logical ground. To that extent, there is no possibility of resorting to such grounds as a means of determining which of the two is 'rational'. But that again is Beardsmore's point: once we reach the primitive levels on which our reactions to events come naturally to us, the possibility of justifying these responses and the beliefs that reflect them comes to an end." (197f)

Whittaker observes that Beardsmore is "willing to let such differences stand." (198) That is to say, Beardsmore's discussion concludes with heavy emphasis on the impossibility of one style of justification quite as if there were no others to consider. Whittaker exhibits discomfort with Beardsmore's presentation when he writes that "fundamental considerations of value" may yield to "extra-philosophical, ordinary means of persuasion" which Beardsmore never considers. But, dismayingly, Whittaker summarizes this part of his discussion with the remark, "The point of all of this is something that Beardsmore understood very well, that every moral disagreement is not objectively solvable." (203) "Objective" receives no elucidation.

Beardsmore's discussion of differences over the application of moral vocabulary and differences in moral perspectives has parallels in the writing of other Swansea philosophers. The terminology varies from case to case -- "language", "language game", "linguistic practice", "perspective", "point of view", "world-view", etc. -- but discussions frequently conclude with emphasis on "incommensurable", "irreducible", "intractable", "permanent" or "radical" difference and leave the same impression: statements are embedded in discrete, self-contained language games and therefore inaccessible to argument, criticism, explanation, justification, objection, etc. from without.

The idea of such self-contained language games naturally raises questions about what Rhees terms the "reality" of discourse, that is, doubts about "whether it makes any difference what you say -- whether there is any point in it anyway; whether there is any point in saying anything anyway."[3] This is not just doubt about the possibility of real dialogue between people with different moral perspectives, world-views and so forth. The skeptical worry extends to one's own statements. Beardsmore and others repeatedly assert that we do not choose perspectives, that our languages are not theories and that our concepts are neither true nor false. These remarks are meant to reassure us that the existence of other "languages" and "perspectives" gives us no reason to doubt or abandon our own. But their refusal to make room for any talk of better or worse when it comes to languages and perspectives is, as Edelman observes, "precisely what may lead one to wonder what difference it really makes that I have the perspective or world-view that I do have." (137) It leads one to doubts about the "reality" of one's own statements.

Such skepticism is not, as Cockburn proposes at one point in his essay on Rhees, an "exaggerated response to what are generally marginal -- in the sense of having little significance -- possibilities." Cockburn has in mind the possibilities of misunderstanding and failure to communicate encountered in everyday life:

We are momentarily baffled … about how she could say what she is now saying in view of what she said yesterday. Perhaps a little pressing would reveal a mutual misunderstanding that might easily be resolved; but we do not pause to find out, or if we do, and fail to locate the misunderstanding, other pressures move us rapidly beyond the sticking point. (11)

But these misunderstandings appear to be matched by actual cases of understanding, so it is more than exaggeration to suggest there is never a point to saying anything. No, the skepticism which concerns Rhees is a response to a specific set of philosophical ideas and formulations. It is a more or less natural reaction to reflections on the particularity and diversity of discourse. The treatment of skepticism about the reality of discourse should address those particular philosophical reflections.

The present volume shows that Swansea philosophers were dissatisfied with their own ways of talking about differences of language and perspective. Mounce, for example, complains that Winch's description of Zande speech makes their statement "There are witches" into a "conceptual truth" exempt from the possibility of criticism. (112) This, in spite of the fact that Mounce's own writing begins with typical Swansea emphasis on the diversity of linguistic practices. According to Michael Weston, Mounce and Phillips claim in their early work on morals that:[4]

there are different moral practices in terms of which the same facts will entail different conclusions … There is an irreducible variety in moral practices and so in the possibility of permanent radical moral disagreement. It is not possible to resolve such disagreements by referring to 'the human good' since what is deemed humanly good is itself determined by moral beliefs. (115)

To the objection that we must determine which conception of human good and harm is right, Mounce and Phillips reply:

The objection … treats the opposing moral perspectives as if they were hypotheses about some state of affairs … in the way that there may be conflicting astronomical theories about a star. But in the latter case we can imagine what sort of evidence might settle the matter for there is something independent of the theories against which they can be checked. But moral perspectives are not theories, they are not interpretations of something more ultimate than themselves. (115)

So far, the discussion is very similar to Beardsmore's. But Mounce becomes uncomfortable with his early view on "moral perspectives". It will not greatly surprise readers of Mounce's commentary on Wittgenstein's Tractatus to learn that he offers a transcendental argument for a form of realism in his later work.[5] Weston reports that Mounce comes to think:

Different moral practices are subject to a common standard, although one we can only know in part … If we … claim to be in possession of the truth about morality, we should have to justify this since it is something equally claimed by our opponents. Such a process of justification, appealing to the existence of a standard valid for all moral agents, leads, Mounce believes, to a recognition of that standard as lying in something like Plato's absolute good. (117)

Weston worries about Mounce's use of terms like "absolute good" and "independent reality". Sounding a familiar Swansea note, he protests that "real" takes "varied senses" in different contexts and that they "do not comprise parts of a general notion of 'reality'," as Mounce seems to require. (114) But the fundamental problem with Mounce's theory does not lie in his notions of the real or absolute. Granted those notions, his theory still does not quiet skeptical worries. Doubts about the reality of discourse arise with the suggestion that statements are embedded in self-contained linguistic practices so as to be inaccessible to criticism or justification. Asserting the existence of a platonic standard does not tell us where that suggestion goes wrong or what the possibilities for discourse in the relevant cases look like. If we had some sense of those things, we might not worry greatly about "absolute good" or "independent reality." At any rate, those notions might appear to us in a different and more revealing light.

Several of the present essays outline another, better targeted response to skepticism about the reality of discourse. It is a criticism of the very idea of self-contained linguistic practices and perspectives. This Swansea self-criticism invokes a second constellation of themes from Rhees' reading of Wittgenstein, viz. those clustering around his ideas about the unity of discourse. Rhees objects to Wittgenstein's frequent comparisons between speaking and playing a game.[6] His reasons for objecting are numerous and complex. One reason is that the comparison invites us to picture speaking as a matter of now making a move in one game, now making a move in another. Another reason is that it tempts us to think of understanding as something like knowledge of the rules of particular games. But, Rhees observes, we use the same words in orders on the construction site, in laboratory protocols, in jokes and in prayers, so the picture of human speech as consisting of moves in self-contained language games is misleading. He counters that our uses of words "hang together" -- with one another and with other aspects of human life. They hang together, he suggests, in a manner analogous to that in which the parts of a conversation hang together.[7] Rhees points out that our understanding of language -- of what people say in conversations, for example -- is unlike knowledge of the rules of a game. For understanding requires a grasp of how the things people say "hang together" and that is not captured in knowledge of the rule that one is to bring a slab when the supervisor shouts "Slab!" and so forth. This is, on Rhees' reading, the insight of Wittgenstein's remark that "to imagine a language means to imagine a form of life"[8], an insight he thinks Wittgenstein obscures by talking of self-contained language games. Rhees himself puts as much emphasis on the unity of discourse as on its diversity:

Speaking is not just one thing. But when you speak, you say something and someone who understands you will know what you have said.

The question of the way in which language hangs together, or the ways in which the different ways of speaking or different language games are connected with one another, is important if one is to see what speech and understanding are: at least as important as the diversity is… .

I do not think you can answer the question what a use of language is unless you consider the question of the way in which the different exercises of speech or language hang together. The use of language is a part of a way of living.[9]

On Rhees' view, skepticism about the reality of discourse turns out to rest on misunderstandings, misunderstandings of what it is to speak, what it is to use language and what it is to understand it. It is Rhees' idea of the unity of discourse on which Cockburn relies when he writes that talk of "operating with different 'concepts' or different 'standards for judging'" obscures the possibilities for argument and criticism (15) and when Edelman states that "one cannot do justice to the different understandings that human beings actually have" while talking of "perspectives" in the way that Phillips does. Hertzberg's complaint that Winch's way of thinking "sharing perspectives" is an oversimplification (39) also seems to trace back to Rhees, although he is not named in this connection.

Rhees' suggestion that discourse hangs together is obviously programmatic. In some respects, this is to be expected. The possibilities for discourse -- for argument, criticism, explanation and so forth -- vary from case to case. But it is programmatic in another, much more serious sense. Rhees says that "dialogue has sense -- or anything that is said has sense -- if living has sense, and not otherwise" and understanding what people say "is not something apart from understanding people and speaking with them."[10] Understanding discourse in this sense is a matter of degree; it grows as grasp on the unity of discourse grows. The articulation of what is said and its unity grows into the articulation of the unity of life. This is an open-ended project that may require resources -- cultural, ethical, spiritual and, as several essays here observe, personal -- beyond what is usual in academic philosophy. This explains the importance Swansea philosophers attach to literature. Rhees thinks it has ways of "finding the sense in and giving sense to, the life that is lived".[11]

One can get a sense of what Rhees might have in mind from Heidi Northwood's essay on Holland. Northwood observes that Holland's "absolute" -- that is to say, non-consequentialist -- ethical view can lead one to act in ways that bring great suffering to oneself and to others. Some will feel that compassion favors flexibility and compromise of absolute principles in such cases. Here it may seem there is one of those intractable differences of "moral perspectives" on compassion of the type that Beardsmore "lets stand". But Northwood argues, via a reading of Sophocles' Ajax, that what consequentialists initially call compassionate flexibility may be a kind of self-regard inconsistent with virtue and that what they first label relentless adherence to principle can be real compassion, a kind of compassion that is "open to limitless suffering." Northwood's argument suggests how apparently intractable differences of moral perspective may be accessible to arguments that exploit the way what people say about compassion "hangs together" with other things they say and with what matters in their lives.

The essays in Sense and Reality give a vivid impression of the qualities of discussion and work in the Swansea department, just as the editor hoped. They also provide a clear if schematic picture of the main themes and problems of the Swansea School. The text might serve as an introduction to its philosophy. Unfortunately, the volume lacks an index. That would have helped readers to gain an overview. The chief faults of the volume are the faults of its subjects. Large themes and problems are hard to control. The writers are sometimes overpowered. Association and suggestion too often take the place of argument and explanation. But the problems are interesting and the approach original. The earnestness of their efforts cannot be faulted.

[1] "Particularity" and "unity" occur in several constructions ("particularity of meaning", "particularity of understanding", "unity of language", "unity of discourse", etc.) in Rhees' notes on Wittgenstein edited by D. Z. Phillips and published under the title Wittgenstein and the Possibility of Discourse (Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing, 2006) as well as in the present volume. These terms are not used to denote particular theses, but to collect related themes. That is how I use them here.

[2] Philosophical Investigations, 2nd ed., translated by G. E. M. Anscombe (Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing, 2001), s. 108.

[3] Wittgenstein and the Possibility of Discourse, p. 244.

[4] H. O. Mounce and D. Z. Phillips, Moral Practices (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1970).

[5] Mounce gives his "realist" interpretation in Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1981).

[6] See "Wittgenstein's Builders" Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, Vol. 60, 1959-1960.

[7] Wittgenstein and the Possibility of Discourse, pp. 46, 84, 86, 124, 141, 182, 253.

[8] Philosophical Investigations, s. 19.

[9] Wittgenstein and the Possibility of Discourse, p. 117.

[10] Wittgenstein and the Possibility of Discourse, pp. 13, 244.

[11] Wittgenstein and the Possibility of Discourse, p. 15.