Sensibility and Sense: The Aesthetic Transformation of the Human World

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Arnold Berleant, Sensibility and Sense: The Aesthetic Transformation of the Human World, Imprint Academic, 2010, 232pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845400767.

Reviewed by Mara Miller, Independent Scholar


Arnold Berleant's latest book, Sensibility and Sense: The Aesthetic Transformation of the Human World, has something for everyone. The wide range of Berleant's aesthetic thinking, draws connections to ethics, politics, and everyday life (as well as to nature and the arts). Also, he is willing to situate aesthetics both within the history of philosophical aesthetics and in relation to current theory and to outline the points of divergence from more mainstream work. For all these reasons,Sensibility and Sense is suitable for students in a number of disciplines outside philosophy, including urban and environmental studies and political science. The chapter on "Celestial Aesthetics," the aesthetics of the sky, for instance, is pure delight.

This is Berleant’s ninth authored book -- he has also co-edited with Allen Carlson two anthologies and a special issue of the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticismdevoted to environmental aesthetics. It provides an introduction to the life work of a major philosopher and a clarification of some of the most important developments in aesthetics over the past quarter century. It also explicates the significance of the environment not only for philosophical aesthetics but for anyone who seeks to understand everyday life, the aesthetics of which, according to Berleant, must be recognized and understood as crucial not only in and of themselves but also in relation to ethics/morality, to politics, and to sociality.

The book maps out new terrain requiring further study: negative aesthetics and the aesthetics of social and political activity. If it is in some sense a looking back to his earlier theorizing, especially in the opening chapters, it is also a probing of new territory only hinted at in his earlier work and in that of other writers. (Berleant's sources include not only -- as usual for him -- literature, philosophers and aestheticians, such as the Frankfurt school, Schutz, Schiller, and of course Burke and Kant, but also writers in various branches of contemporary theory, including the familiar Berger and Luckman, Deleuze, and Lyotard. The chapter on "Perceptual Politics" devotes brief sections to the aesthetics of Kennan Ferguson, F. R. Ankersmit, Jacques Ranciere, and Josef Chytry, while "Art, Terrorism, and the Negative Sublime" takes off from the work of Katya Mandoki. Berleant's work is also informed by research in psychology and in the sociology of knowledge, as well as by Walter Laqueur's theoretical analysis of terrorism.)


A word about the structure of the book may be not out of place, since the titles of the three parts and many of the chapters are less than fully illuminating. "Part One: Grounding the World" (with chapters too blandly titled "Beginning," "Understanding the Aesthetic," "The Aesthetic Argument," and "The World as Experienced") introduces Berleant's basic views and their connections and (more frequently) disagreements with other well-known analyses. Readers familiar with his work can comfortably skip Part One entirely (until they are motivated to return to it by a comment later in the book). Even new readers of Berleant may find Chapter 5, "A Rose by Any Other Name" (in Part Two for some reason, though it belongs with the introductory and general Part One), the easiest place to begin since it summarizes the most difficult arguments of the earlier chapters and of Berleant's philosophy as a whole, indicates their significance, and outlines the importance of new developments in the field, a number of which are discussed with care in Parts Two and Three.

Several of these later chapters present studies that rely on his overall philosophical commitments but are independent of each other; they can easily be read (or assigned) alone or in any order. Berleant's approach is to examine the broader philosophical context of a topic and only then to examine the philosophical specifics of the topic. Part Two, which covers the aesthetics of particular aspects of the environment, includes "The Soft Side of Stone" (which might well be taken in tandem with phenomenologist John Sallis's Stone[1]), "An Aesthetics of Urbanism," and "Celestial Aesthetics."

Part Three addresses ways of thinking about the aesthetic that have emerged -- in most cases relatively recently -- either as a result of developments within theory or as a result of social and technological innovations (or both). I found "The Negative Aesthetics of Everyday Life" one of the most valuable chapters -- not only for understanding our everyday (modern and post-modern) experience, but also, surprisingly, for analyzing twentieth-century and contemporary literature. The chapter on the aesthetics of terrorism raises points with wide repercussions that deserve further study.


Berleant's primary contribution has been his decades-long challenge to the axiomatic idea that disinterestedness is essential to aesthetic experience. The argument is recapitulated in Part I, but can be found fully worked out in his earlier books.[2] In its place he offers us "engagement:"

absorption in aesthetic appreciation may at times be so complete that the viewer, reader, or listener abandons entirely the consciousness of a separate self and enters totally into the aesthetic world. This is familiar to many people in the experience of being caught up in a novel or in the virtual world of cinema. When we are not misdirected by contrary expectations, we can cultivate the ability to become appreciatively engaged on many different artistic occasions. I call such appreciation "aesthetic engagement", and when it is achieved most intensely and completely, it fulfills the possibilities of aesthetic experience. (Aesthetics and Environment, p. 87)

The meaning and applicability of aesthetic engagement are discussed in chapter 5 and are developed further in later chapters.

Historically, one of Berleant's most crucial contributions has been his expansion of the scope of aesthetics. Most important is the attention he has drawn to the experience of landscape and other kinds of environments, whether natural or built, and his probing of ways to open up our philosophical understanding of the "aesthetic" so as to enable us to accommodate the challenges landscape and environment pose to earlier thinking about aesthetic "objects." He has insisted on expanding the scope or object (conceptually speaking) of aesthetic scrutiny from the physical object (typically an art object, but including sometimes aspects of natural environments, such as mountain vistas, that can be understood as analogous to art objects) or discrete sensory experience (a musical or theatrical performance) to the whole world. Importantly, this has included the everyday and "negative aesthetics," those aspects of everyday life that seem prima facie to haveno aesthetic value: "sensory experience that has no clear positive value, the underside of beauty, so to say" (p. 155). (See below.)

Beyond that, Berleant was one of the first philosophers to emphasize built as opposed to "natural" landscape and environment (aside from architecture) as an art, and to acknowledge "situations" and events -- including urban environments, ritual, behavior, politics, etc. -- as aesthetic phenomena requiring philosophical examination.

Perhaps for these reasons, Berleant's work has been especially influential in Europe (particularly Finland, where for years he has figured prominently in international environmental aesthetics conferences, including those organized by Yrjö Sepanmaa, and in Poland, where a volume on his work has recently been published by the prestigious University of Warsaw Institute for Philosophy[3]).

To be sure, even in the United States, he has not been alone in these projects. He has been joined by two generations of younger scholars whom he has influenced and who came of age philosophically after the time when "happenings," environmental art, and "performance art" had begun to be taken for granted as art forms, and when access to non-Western arts had become common enough to challenge Western preconceptions.

Equally important is his insistence on the "aesthetic grounding of the human world" -- the primacy of sense perception to experience -- the somatic world of sensory experience:

Thus with the expansion of perceptual experience to include all the senses and to extend beyond a merely psychological attitude or mental state to the aware, sensing body, the meaning and characterization of aesthetic experience have undergone major changes. What remains of critical importance, however, is the strong emphasis on sensory perception and on the intrinsic character of such perception. (pp. 86-87)

Finally, his insistence on recognizing the complex relations between aesthetics and ethics/the moral domain is valuable (and is one of the reasons his work on negative aesthetics is so useful in understanding recent literature). Indeed, he argues that negative aesthetics can

produce not only aesthetic pain but moral suffering, both of which are, at times, inseparable . . . [The] capability of identifying negative aesthetic values gives the aesthetic the possibility of becoming an incisive force in social criticism, a largely untried region of aesthetic activity but a potentially powerful one. (p. 88)

The chapter devoted to Negative Aesthetics explores the experiential/ aesthetic and the philosophical/ theoretical implications of experiences of the type that occurs when an aesthetic situation has a predominately negative character that outweighs the positive, for example by being trite, perceptually shallow, offensive, demeaning, dismaying, or even harmful or revolting.

Berleant's analysis requires distinctions between negative aesthetics and "negative criticism":

Negative criticism thus does not necessarily exclude positive values but may find that they are in some way unfulfilled or unrealized. Negative aesthetics is distinguished by its scope. There are circumstances, though, where no positive value is present or intended or where the merit of an entire object or situation is entirely obscured by negative factors. What I want to call negative aesthetics refers to whole domains of sensibility suffused with negative value . . . Works with no redeeming qualities, from those that are trite, baldly unsubtle, overly sentimental or maudlin to those that are sadistic, degrading, or damaging. There is plain bad art just as there are situations that are aesthetically offensive or painful. (p. 159)

Here he overstates the case -- even bad art may have some redeeming features. He continues:

And, moreover, because aesthetic perception is direct and immediate, not always intense or associated with art, and often common and even commonplace, the aesthetically negative often slips by unnoticed and eludes critical scrutiny, settling into vague discomfiture. Part of this discomfort, as we shall see, may result from the subtle presence of negativity or from the very failure to recognize that aesthetic negativity is indeed present. The difference, then, between defective art and negative aesthetic value is that between a deficiency in aesthetic merit and cases in which negative value is actively present. (p. 160)

The distinctions Berleant is focusing on are important ones and operate across several categories: intentionality versus inadvertence, art versus everyday objects, fine art versus popular art, successful versus not-very-successful art or art that is poor through lack of skill or imagination. On the one hand, negative aesthetics may indicate art that is simply unsuccessful or unsuccessful aspects of an otherwise aesthetically successful work of art or situation or environment. Some (successful) art, by contrast, may require negativity to get its point across (a crucifixion, for instance). Other works (successful but incorporating negative aspects) may challenge prevalent aesthetic standards and in so doing seem negative at the time -- although time may make those negative dimensions part of later aesthetic pleasure.

In a weak sense, negative aesthetics in art (what is unpleasant or painful or ineffective, for example) may be unintentional: the result of positive values that "are in some way unfulfilled or unrealized" (p. 160), resulting in art that is ineffective or whose effects are different from those the artist had hoped for.

Equally important -- and with far-reaching repercussions -- is the complexity of negative aesthetics in some situations:

Nor are aesthetic values singular or homogeneous. A situation may possess complex and even incompatible value. A dramatic situation, for example, may be at the same time bizarre, ludicrous, pathetic, and perhaps even tragic, combinations of the sort that Harold Pinter was a master at evoking. Moreover, in considering aesthetic value we need not be committed to seeking a quality or feature inhering in an object, as if beauty were simply one factor added to others. We might prefer, as Gilles Deleuze does, to consider it a force in art that is exerted on the body and manifested in sensation. (p. 157)

This quality of possessing contradictory or incompatible aesthetic values may prove valuable in understanding the modern and the post-modern.


Although Berleant lists many of the undesirable qualities that render aesthetic experience negative, he does not explain how we might determine these categories or how and why they vary cross-culturally and even within a given culture (historically -- often our aesthetic standards and valuations change even within a short period -- and across sub-cultures) -- nor even how he comes by the list. Granted that, to the extent that aesthetics is based on physical/somatic experience, it may well have determinations that are close to universal; still, what people find even physically painful (to take what might seem to be a fairly clear-cut case) varies enormously across cultures and sub-cultures (studies of cows giving more milk when listening to Mozart than to Nine Inch Nails to the contrary). Some discussion of taste -- the apparent agreement among people over what is aesthetically agreeable -- which was, after all, one of the founding problems of the field of aesthetics in the eighteenth century, would seem, therefore, to be helpful. In its absence, the study seems irresponsibly ethno-centric.

The short-changing of cross-cultural perspectives in the discussion of negative aesthetics is characteristic of the whole book -- and surprising, given that Berleant's first-hand cross-cultural experience is deep and varied, and that he is always thoughtful. It is especially peculiar since he singles out "comparative aesthetics," which for him includes both cross-cultural and historical aesthetics, as one of the challenges to the theoretical scope of current aesthetics (p. 87).

This short-changing is regrettable for several reasons. First, it deprives readers of the full value of Berleant's knowledge and perspective. At the same time it confines us -- as is far too frequently the case with Anglo-American philosophers -- to a relatively narrow range of human experience: the Euro-centric world. This range no longer does justice even to our everyday lives (which are today for so many lived within truly multi-cultural standards). Still less does it do justice to the broader human experience in terms of which philosophers so often frame claims (speaking about "art" or "language" or "rights" or "experience" or "body") -- the universal or absolute claims philosophers often prefer to analysis of everyday life. Beyond that, leaving these domains out of the discussion perpetuates in the intellectual realm the social injustices many philosophers and theorists are trying so hard to rectify (through both analysis and social action).

Leaving out perspectives from non-Euro-centric cultures deprives the philosophers and other actors in our aesthetics communities of information that would help us as we coordinate and evaluate competing claims on aesthetic resources and attention. Aesthetics as a field emerged in the eighteenth century largely due, I would argue, to the competing types of aesthetics and information about other cultures that were introduced into British and European daily life by items of trade (and to a lesser extent by narratives of life abroad -- especially in Asia and the Americas).[4] In spite of the rapid acceptance of foreign objects such as ceramics, furniture, and silks, and even the construction at home of large-scale installations (such as gardens and buildings) along exotic models, there remained a strong consensus -- a preference, if you will -- sometimes for familiar aesthetics, at other times, seemingly unpredictably, for foreign items or aesthetics. This widely shared "taste" -- along with the enjoyment of the new -- had to be accounted for. Philosophers became more and more interested in why we appreciate things in this way.

The evaluation, enjoyment, acceptance, and rejection of varieties of competing aesthetics provided one of the philosophical as well as experiential grounds of modern aesthetics. Expressing his own aesthetic choices -- preferences for the "interesting" or more stimulating over the bland or "boring," or for quiet over noisy environments, for example -- as universal human preferences makes it difficult to weigh the pros and cons of aesthetic alternatives, both among themselves and between the aesthetic and the ethical, something we are frequently required to do. And it is inaccurate, does the field a disservice, and perpetrates a long-standing Euro-centric bias that has unfortunate consequences on many levels. This is related to the fact that Berleant pays insufficient attention to his own biases and ethnocentrism. It risks needlessly offending those less fortunate than he in his aesthetic experiences, and it risks missing valuable aesthetic experiences because he doesn't already understand their value.

In spite of this familiar (if in Berleant's case unnecessary) bias, however, this enjoyable book is an extremely valuable contribution to philosophical aesthetics and to our understanding of life as a whole.

[1] Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1994.

[2] For a more thorough analysis, see Arnold Berleant, The Aesthetics of Environment (Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1992), Aesthetics and Environment, Variations on a Theme (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2005), and Rethinking Aesthtics, Rogue Essays on Aesthetics and the Arts (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2004).

[3] Sztuka i Filozofia (Studies in Philosophy), number 10, 2010, special issue on the philosophy of Arnold Berleant, edited by Bogna J. Obidzinska.

[4] Leibniz had early on grasped the importance of reconciling contrasting ethics when he began to read about the Chinese. As Chinese aesthetics began to enter British awareness in the seventeenth century, through travelers' accounts and then decorative arts, prints, and, by the mid-eighteenth century, gardens, they seemed to challenge the social order as well -- both politics and ethics.