Sensibility and the Sublime

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David Weissman, Sensibility and the Sublime, Ontos, 2013, 120pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381610.

Reviewed by Michael Deckard, Lenoir-Rhyne University


This concise work argues for a 'relational view' regarding the nature of sensibility: the enjoyment of art and nature concerns both the perception of it (subject) and art/nature itself (object) -- neither should be dismissed. Written in a style unique to Weissman, the balance of a Cartesian perspective and a Peircian one is the goal: "Sensibility anchors the three-way dynamic of aesthesis, criticism, and the history and philosophy of art" (9). How might the mind's interiority and selfhood become more in tune with externality and a metaphysics that allows for a succession of thoughts that are clarified or revised? Weissman thinks that art and nature are capable of helping us see how aesthetics as both a study of human perception and a criticism and analysis of fine art are to be combined, especially in a time a deep wound has been cleft between the enjoyment of art and its criticism, and between the artist and the perceiver. He notes the historical origin of aesthetics[1] as a philosophical discipline, but is not particularly concerned with it. He does refer to the history of philosophy, however, throughout the book.

The volume's four chapters do not immediately reveal a form or structure. Chapter one, "Sensibility", presents the two perspectives, Cartesian interiority and Peircian exteriority. The former assumes that self-awareness is capable of full transparency, or 'resonance': "Resonance is usefully vague: it signifies A's receptivity to perceptual, emotional, or ideational content and B's awareness and appraisal of A and its content" (14). The latter tests hypotheses, looks for evidence, and reintegrates new information with old, confirming all data. Weissman thinks both of these are incomplete without the other. We are to be like Nietzsche's tightrope walker, the artist never fully catering to the audience, but also taking the audience to heart. Analogously, the art-lover walks the same tightrope. In twentieth-century aesthetics, it is like Collingwood versus Beardsley: one makes the mistake of looking too much to the artist's intention (by re-enacting his or her thoughts) when creating a work, the other too little (as in the 'intentionalist fallacy'). "How can artistic creation", Weissman writes, "be so effective or artistic experience so lucid in the absence of words or concepts adequate to the work at hand?" (23). This may be said to be a problem of aesthetics par excellence: what is it about aesthesis or sensibility that bridges subject and object and relates them in a meaningful way?

Chapter two, "Applications", attempts to apply "sensibility's principal qualifiers before considering aesthetics" (45). In other words, how might sensibility (or aesthesis) work in general before applying it to art. In practical life, abstract thought, socialization and ethics, and in spirituality (all titles of subsections), sensibility enables human interaction with the world outside. We cannot exist or survive without the continual reworking of curiosity, memory, imagination, feeling -- Weissman provocatively says that the first pages of Hume'sTreatise and Plato's Sophist have deep affinities. Yet, for example, postmodern literary critics entirely rule out one side of this dilemma: "they prescribe a book's meaning rather than search within it for evidence of the author's intentions" (46). Weissman's point is that this applies as much to socialization, ethics, or spirituality as it does to aesthetics. The key then to the relational view's application to aesthetics is that: "Sensibility . . . registers the properties of things beautiful in themselves; it generates the experience of beauty in a responsive subject; or it experiences beauty when responding to properties in other things" (51). The relational view, then, avoids, on the one hand, Plato, Aristotle, or Hegel's objectivism, and,on the other hand, Nietzsche's or Kant's subjectivism.

Chapter three, "Irresolution", furthers the relational view by attempting to bridge the different perspectives of the artist's and the perceiver's aesthetic experience of works of art. Indeed, most of the history of aesthetics attempts either the perceiver's or the artist's perspective, rarely both.[2] Even the phrase, 'artist perspective', assumes that the artist is not a perceiver of his or her own work. Additionally, "artists are forced to choose -- please clients or please themselves -- when buyers reject work that isn't likely to enhance their status or earn a profit" (63). This applies as much to pastry chefs as to architects or poets. Yet it is difficult to ascertain what it is about sensibility that can be termed 'rules' or structure across the arts besides referring to aspects of sensibility such as imagination, memory, and feeling. However, perceivers may mirror artists:

A reader's imagination fills gaps in a novel's story. Viewers scan a painting, building or design: their perceptions are selective but formed by innate rubrics made determinate by the particularities of personal experience. Perceivers color and form the data received in ways detailed when Kant described mind's synthesis of experience. (65)

Yet Weissman provides Kant with a Peircian pause, since there is a development of sensibility over time: one doesn't encounter the same Mona Lisa twice. Furthermore, even curators who choose what is 'great' art or not must "defer to the community of educated sensibilities" (67). Yet, one element that returns again and again is beauty. Weissman provides us with a definition and analysis of beauty (in contrast to his title's "sublime") . He holds that a list of properties cannot be assigned to beauty and that the 'ideal perceiver' cannot define beauty. He writes that "beauty is sensibility's response to some things thought or perceived" (78). Taste is that which apprehends real beauty or ugliness in an object, and yet taste can be educated. Take, for example, nature vs. the arts: can one be beautiful and one be ugly? Listening to a prominent philosopher's denial that nature can be beautiful is a case in point. Robert Pippin, following the lead of Hegel and Clive Bell, supports the denial of nature's beauty.[3] And Stephanie Ross, a 'neo-Humean', while not denigrating nature, formulates a way of ranking aesthetic experiences not unlike Weissman.[4]

Weissman uses six axes to begin answering the question.

Obscurity to Clarity

The first axis, clarity and obscurity, finds its basis in Platonic as well as Cartesian thought. Although clarity of language describes things "indexically by naming or pointing", distinctness "requires description or direct perception of a thing's constitutive properties" (34). However, many of our intimations are not "essentially linguistic or propositional". There is something obscure then about sensibility that cannot be rendered clear or distinct.[5] While there is a visual analogue (shadow to light) that assumes positive and negative valences, Weissman' relational view supports the reconfiguration of this axis. Taking Plato's claim in Symposium that beauty is the telos of aesthetic experience, we cannot categorize sensible states in terms of clarity or distinctness. In chapter two, Weissman states

Clarity is a challenge, one sometimes answered by recovering the focus surrendered during meditation. Rather than do something or go somewhere, we concentrate . . . Clarification comes with analysis (the inventory of an idea's proper parts) and synthesis (the whole created by organizing the parts). (57)

Even a musician and a listener cannot clearly intuit (contra Croce and Collingwood) precisely what went into the composition.

Inner to Outer

This second axis, according to Weissman, was conflated with the first by Plato, Berkeley, Hume, and Husserl. In other words, one cannot gain perfect clarity with the inner alone. Even clarity requires some back-and-forth between inner and outer. While the Cartesian subjectivist approach conflates the inner and clarity, the outer and the obscure can also not be entirely conflated. This distinction (i.e., keeping ideas or theories to interiority) is "insufficient for people making dinner or raising children: elegance doesn't make ideas true or plans effective" (57). The application of the relational view to this second axis is to see both axes as interactive, and as applied to aesthetics, that there must be a "complementarity of artists and the people who see their work". This is the 'resonance' mentioned above between artists and perceivers.[6]


In the introduction, Weissman refers to Monroe Beardsley's instrumentalist definition of aesthetic value, that aesthetic liking can only be referred to by "people educated in a domain: their understanding, feelings, and associations are appropriate to the works seen or heard" (7). In other words, they have "educated taste". Weissman believes that sensibility, interiority, and selfhood are "three words with a single referent but different emphases . . . We know ourselves as resonant centers having values, aims, skills, and points of view" (8). How does the axis of association relate to sensibility, interiority, and selfhood? Perhaps Hume is the primary locus of such an axis. Indeed Hume's division of impressions and ideas, on the one hand, and original and secondary impressions, on the other, speaks to this formative axis, as Weissman points out. Examples like music, abstract art, buildings, and dance attempt to minimize association, unlike linguistic art. Metaphysically, unlike Aristotle's substance, sensibility's axes may be qualified: "substance is always qualified by quality and quantity, while several of the axes qualifying sensibility may themselves be unqualified: value may be neutral; there may be no feelings or associations provoked by a primary qualifier" (44). Furthermore, association, as first described by Locke, can become more powerful than the 'original' or literal reference -- whether for the perceiver or the maker.

Affective States

Do feelings and associations have a similar status as an axis of sensibility? All affective states, whether feelings, moods, or emotions, qualify sensibility. Even when a work of art leaves one unmoved, being unmoved is an affective state. Yet Weissman describes this axis as having two versions, one with "indifference at one extremity while emotional intensity rises by degrees to the other end. The second locates indifference in the middle, with pleasure and pain at the extremes. These two versions are dynamically linked" (59).

Value and Valuation

As mentioned above, Beardsley emphasizes 'aesthetic value'. In a certain sense, aesthetic value cannot be reduced to feelings or associations. Defending some kind of cognitive value within sensibility is key here. To quote Beardsley, "If value is not a quality of perceptual objects, like their redness or grandeur, then it must be a relation, and consist in someone's taking a certain attitude toward the object" (7). Aesthetic value is thus a particular kind of attitude toward an object. But which is primary, Weissman asks, "cognition or feeling? The question is ambiguous because one might cite value or cause as the reason for ascribing primacy to one or the other" (29). To complicate this question even further, valuation is "approval or disapproval", whereas value is "the worth ascribed to things by virtue of their properties" (39). The variations in response regarding value mirror feelings and associations, but cannot be reduced to one of the other axes, even if they do overlap.

Active or Quiescent

The last axis confirms Dewey's resistance to the mere disinterestedness or contemplation of aesthetic value. When art or music contributes to action, for example, dance, or buying beautiful clothing to keep warm, pragmatism holds sway. However, "Actions that control and clarify the things qualifying sensibility rebuke Kant and Dewey alike: one for supposing that purpose is always inimical to aesthesis, the other for implying that aesthesis is or should always be a fulfillment achieved in the course of action" (60). While avoiding the reduction of sensibility (i.e,. aesthesis) to either disinterestedness or pragmatism, the relational account includes this axis without requiring action or quiescence.

Chapter four, "Interiority and Selfhood", is the most intriguing yet elusive chapter. What is its role in the structure of this book since it does not include the six axes? It does include brief discussions of Aristotle, Plotinus, Descartes, Leibniz, Hume, Kant, Hegel, Schelling, Husserl, Heidegger, Danto as well as earlier works of Weissman himself (not to mention the artists/composers Van Gogh, Raphael, Mozart, Kiefer, Warhol, Duchamp, Donizetti, Balanchine, and Britten). Weissman formulates an eleven-point argument for sensibility in light of the self. Unlike Charles Taylor, who sees a growing, historical "interiority" and shows in detail the historical development through modernity of the "making of modern identity", Weissman does not present a coherent picture.[7] Rather, a fragmented self, albeit relational, speaks to the interiority of the chapter's title: "We need an account of interiority that elides the Cartesian point of view" (91). Two subsections of this chapter, taste and judgment, which scarcely take up a page, briefly recount what the self encounters in interiority: "judgment is an appropriate expression of sensibility's autonomy" (102).

Weissman truly rethinks and profoundly illuminates the metaphor of sensibility. For that, he is to be commended. The most glaring lacuna is the fact that the sublime is an afterthought, a postscript, only mentioned in the last five pages. His argument by no means centers on it, nor truly includes it. The primary idea one is left with concerns sensibility and its axes. Thus, 'Sensibility and Aesthetics', or better 'Sensibility and Beauty', might have been better titles, but less alliterative. The 'deeper wound', however, mentioned at the beginning of this book, which sits at the congruence of subject and object, should have the last word: "contemporary aesthetics emphasizes criticism and the history and philosophy of art while neglecting the pleasure, insight, and cultivation on which they depend" (1). Indeed, this deeper wound is profound and thus "more than beautiful" (109), possibly even sublime.

[1] For example, Weissman writes, "Sensibility was the principal content for aesthetics from Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, and Baumgarten to Hume and Kant. It was eclipsed by Hegel's emphasis on the history and criticism of the 'fine arts.'" (10) For an analysis of sensibility at the historical origin of aesthetics as a philosophical discipline, see The Science of Sensibility: Reading Burke's Philosophical Enquiry, eds. Koen Vermeir and Michael Funk Deckard (Dordrecht: Springer, 2012)

[2] Maurice Merleau-Ponty could be seen as a key exception to this claim. See, for example, his "Cézanne's Doubt", in Sense and Non-Sense (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1964).

[3] See Robert Pippin's 2011 American Society of Aesthetics-Eastern Division address, "After the Beautiful: Hegel and the Philosophy of Visual Modernism".

[4] See her "Comparing and Sharing Taste: Reflections on Critical Advice", Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 70/4 (2012): 363-371.

[5] For a profound commentary on obscurity in aesthetics, see Baldine Saint Girons, "Burke, the Revenge of Obscurity, and the Foundation of the Aesthetic," in The Science of Sensibility, 305-326.

[6] As, for example, when Weissman describes Cézanne's and Kandinsky's own words regarding the production of their art, e.g., "Cézanne proposed that the painter go from nature to the Louvre before returning to nature with the perspectives of the Louvre" (68).

[7] See Charles Taylor, Sources of the Self: The Making of the Modern Identity (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1989). In a useful article, "Language and Human Nature", in Human Agency and Language (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985), Taylor divides language into two realms: designative and expressive. Taylor thus easily divides most philosophers into two camps. Skinner, Quine, Davidson in the designative camp, and Herder through the Romantics in the expressive camp. If I read Weissman rightly, he is attempting a way through this impasse, to marry the designative and expressive through the concept of sensibility.