Sensorama: A Phenomenalist Analysis of Spacetime and Its Contents

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Michael Pelczar, Sensorama: A Phenomenalist Analysis of Spacetime and Its Contents, Oxford University Press, 2015, 239pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732655.

Reviewed by Jonathan A. Simon, New York University


There are few in contemporary analytic philosophy willing to defend phenomenalism, the view that physical objects reduce to permanent possibilities of sensation, and fewer still who are willing to give time the same treatment. Michael Pelczar is the exception. In this book, he offers an engaging, unflinching defense of an ambitious form of neo-Millian idealism, radical phenomenalism, according to which spacetime and its contents (and also selves and intentionality) are logical constructions out of experiences and counterfactuals involving them. Notably, Pelczar's radical phenomenalism is an atemporalist development of the Millian suggestion that physical objects are permanent possibilities of sensation: for the radical phenomenalist, experiences no more exist in time than they do in space. His view is also scientifically informed in the sense that he wants the actual permanent possibilities of sensation to give rise to the spatiotemporal world as science reveals it.

Pelczar's argumentative approach is quite novel. He begins with a series of original arguments that our experiences of time -- of temporal duration, succession, and so on -- are not themselves spatiotemporally structured, and from this he concludes that idealism must be true. Thus, rather than atemporalism being a concomitant of a scientifically informed idealism, it is idealism which is a concomitant of a scientifically informed account of temporal phenomenology.

The book has two parts. In the first Pelczar sets the stage and then makes his original case for atemporalism and by extension idealism. In the second he advances new arguments in favor of phenomenalist idealism over Kantian, Berkeleyan or Leibnizian alternatives. This is a rich book, replete with original, substantive argumentation at each step. I will survey highlights from each chapter, focusing on chapters three to five, which make the argument for idealism e.

Chapter one is an extended introduction. Chapter two is a generally accessible account of the basic concepts of special relativity, which explores the philosophical underpinnings of our concept of simultaneity.

In chapter three we begin the substantive argumentative work of the book: the case for atemporalism. Atemporalism, for Pelczar, is the claim that no aspect of our mental lives is characterized by objective temporal succession: experiences may be as of duration, but they do not endure; experiences may be as of change, but they do not change; etc. In chapter three Pelczar challenges the claim that we have direct introspective evidence that experiences happen in temporal succession, a claim that has been made historically by Kant, Locke and Mill, and more recently by Phillips (2010), Soteriou (2010) and Rashbrook (2013).

The meat of the chapter is a single argument that Pelczar deploys against this view (p. 59). The argument has three premises. Say that a diachronically simple experience is an experience that does not have temporal parts that are themselves experiences. Pelczar's first premise is that every experience is ultimately composed of diachronically simple experiences. His second premise is that every experience, including diachronically simple experiences, is an experience as of temporal succession. The third premise is that if at least one experience as of succession is diachronically simple, then introspection alone gives us no basis for thinking that any aspect of our mental lives is characterized by objective temporal succession. From these premises, it follows that introspection alone gives us no basis for thinking that any aspect of our mental lives is characterized by objective temporal succession.

This is not a version of the skeptical point that because illusion is possible perception cannot justify belief in an external world. According to the position Pelczar is challenging, one has but to look into the nature of experience as of succession to see that it must involve successions of experiences. A counterexample suffices to challenge such a claim about essences, and if a diachronically simple experience can present a succession (in its content) without itself involving a phenomenal succession (of vehicle), then we have our counterexample.

One worry is that extensionalists, who think that experiences as of succession are generally complexes of simpler experiences, and snapshot theorists, who deny that there are experiences as of succession, may well reject premise two, the premise that all experiences are experiences as of succession.

But I am more worried about premise three. This premise is falsified if introspection can allow us to infer that some aspect of our mental lives is characterized by objective temporal succession. For this to happen, we don't have to conclude that all experiences of succession involve a succession of experience. It would suffice if we could conclude that experiences take time. It would also suffice if we could conclude that experiences of succession are relations between experiencers and actual successions (as many of Pelczar's opponents, like Phillips (2010) and Soteriou (2010), think). Finally, it would suffice if we could know via a combination of introspection and memory that our experience changes. But this is commonplace: I remember that I was experiencing a sunrise, and I introspect that I no longer am. Note that such an inference is available even to those, like Chuard (2011), who deny that we have experiences as of temporal succession or change.

In chapter four, Pelczar, building on his (2014), advances his first argument for atemporalism, inspired by some remarks in Russell (1914) to the effect that our experiences are confined to single points of spacetime. The argument turns on the cautious unity thesis: "Necessarily, if consciousness is in time, then the phenomenology that characterizes the conscious experience of any given conscious subject at any given time is unified". Pelczar argues that this principle is inconsistent with serialism, which is the thesis that the neural correlates of our experiences -- in particular, of diachronically simple ones -- are themselves spatio-temporally extended. Thus, the correlates of our diachronically simple experiences must be spatiotemporal point events. He then goes on to argue that if serialism is false, this is a big problem for materialism and almost as big of a problem for dualism.

Why does Pelczar take cautious unity to falsify serialism? He thinks that according to serialism, "every conscious being is, at some level of description, never conscious" (p. 74). For example, if a visual experience is realized by a sequence of two neural events, r1 and r7, one will not count as undergoing that experience at r6 (or indeed at any subinterval of the span between r1 and r7). Pelczar then argues (p. 76) that even when the realization of, say, a visual and an auditory experience overlaps, there may be no moment at which one has a unified audiovisual experience. For suppose the auditory experience is realized by a sequence spanning r3 to r5. Since this is only a subinterval of the span between r1 and r7, by Pelczar's logic the subject does not have a visual experience then. Thus, in the span of r1 to r7 the subject has both an auditory experience and a visual experience without having a unified audiovisual experience and also without alternating between an auditory experience and a visual experience. This conflicts with the cautious unity thesis.

We can expect serialists to resist Pelczar's allegation that if serialism is true then every conscious being is, at some level of description, never conscious (see, for example, Lee (2014)). Why think that if the realization of my visual experience comprises events that span the duration of r1 to r7, then I cannot truly be said to be undergoing that experience during subintervals of r1 to r7? Does not the arrow count as moving during every moment of its journey?

Pelczar could reply that in the case of the arrow, we need only appeal to the infinitesimally near future to make out whether it is moving right now. In the case of phenomenal experience this is not so: we are considering neural events that may be finite spatiotemporal distances from one another. And there is certainly something puzzling about the idea that my phenomenal state right now depends on what my brain will do in the near future (a line of argument that Pelczar (2014) pursues but that is regrettably absent from the present volume). But the matter is far from settled.

In chapter five Pelczar discusses the stream of consciousness. He argues that Dainton (2006)'s temporal overlap view is the best (temporalist) view of the stream of consciousness but that dualists (who reject serialism) who accept it are committed to rejecting the CPT-reversal invariance (the quantum analogue of time-reversal invariance) of the psychophysical laws. He then outlines his own preferred atemporalist analysis of the stream of consciousness.

The CPT argument (pp. 95-101) also draws from Pelczar (2014) and is his second argument for atemporalism, though unlike the argument of the previous chapter, it presupposes the falsity of materialism. The first premise of this argument is that complex experiences of temporal succession or change involve diachronically simple experiences of temporal succession or change in (spatio-) temporal sequence. The second is that serialism is false. The third premise is that it is a fundamental law of experience that "the totality of all human experiences does bear interpretation as including myriad veridical perceptions of states of affairs that conform to various laws of physics" (p.96).

The argument also appeals to CPT-invariance. Newtonian physics is time-reversal invariant, but quantum theory is not. There are patterns of particle decay that privilege an orientation. But it turns out that if you reverse charge (C) and parity (P) along with time (T), you recover a symmetry -- CPT-reversal invariance -- which is valid even in the quantum field theoretic regime.

Pelczar's argument proceeds as follows. Imagine a single stream of consciousness as of a ball rolling down a hill from starting point A to midpoint B to lowest point C. By premise one, this involves diachronically simple but temporally structured experiences in sequence: first, AB, the experience of the ball moving from A to B, and then BC, the experience of the ball moving from B to C. But if by premise two we reject serialism, then AB is realized by a point-event, x, and BC is realized by another, y, that is in x's future light cone.

So now consider a CPT-reversal of our world, Unworld. In Unworld, x*, the charge and parity (CP)-reversed version of x, is in the future light cone of y*, the CP-reversed version of y. The laws of physics apply to this world as to our own. But in this world, Pelczar alleges, my experience will be of BC followed by AB: the ball falling from midpoint B to lowest point C, then from starting point A to midpoint B. This course of experience is not an experience of a scenario consistent with the laws of physics (modulo quantum tunneling and so on) and so it violates the fundamental law of experience. The immediate conclusion is that the fundamental law of experiences violates CPT-reversal invariance. Pelczar thinks we should give up on premise one; in particular on the claim that experiences can occur in (spatio-)temporal sequence.

One question for Pelczar is whether the law of experience he describes could be fundamental even on a dualist picture. For this law is essentially a ceteris paribus law. As a rule, other things being equal, ceteris paribus laws are not fundamental.

A second concern is that even if something like this law is fundamental, it needn't violate CPT-reversal invariance. Remember that CPT-reversal is more than time reversal. The CP-reverse of x, x*, is the charge and parity reverse of x. Such a reversal maps a particle to an antiparticle. But on some accounts, antiparticles are effectively particles travelling back in time (Feynman 1987). So we aren't bound to think that if x gives rise to an experience, x* gives rise to the same experience, and what is more we have some independent motivation for thinking that the experience x* gives rise to will be the time-reversal of the experience x gives rise to (see Meyer (2015) for a related point).

We might also ask whether it is really a problem for the dualist if some psychophysical law fails to be CPT-reversal invariant. CPT-reversal invariance only purports to characterize the physical laws, but a dualist's psychophysical laws aren't physical. If we take mind to be fundamental, and we accept that charge and parity come with a temporal orientation, why not allow that mind does as well?

A final point: readers may be puzzled by Pelczar's presentation of this argument as a challenge to Dainton's temporal overlap theory. The distinctive element in Dainton's theory is that the stream of consciousness involves diachronically complex experiences that share temporal experiential parts. But Pelczar's case only involves diachronically simple experiences. This could be good news for Pelczar as it potentially widens the scope of the challenge. See Dainton (2014) for discussion. Still, what explains the discrepancy? I surmise that it has something to do with the daylight between Dainton's account of the overlap involved in the stream of consciousness and Pelczar's, a subject to which I now turn.

This takes us to the other intriguing line of thought in chapter five: we get a first glimpse at Pelczar's envisioned atemporal analysis of the stream of consciousness. Like Dainton, Pelczar wants to employ the idea that the mereological (or, as he says, logical) overlap of experiences is what makes the stream of consciousness possible. But where for Dainton this overlap is a special kind of diachronic overlap -- the sharing of diachronically simpler experiences by diachronically more complex experiences -- for Pelczar it is a matter of the overlap of phenomenal property (qualia) instantiations. Pelczar agrees with Dainton that we must begin with a notion of overlap of content: one experience streams into another only if the second picks up where the first left off, e.g. the first is an experience as of a c-note followed by a d-note, and the second is an experience as of a d-note followed by an e-note. For Dainton, such an experience streams into the other only if, in addition to this phenomenal overlap of content, there is also a mereological overlap of temporal experiential parts. For Pelczar, such an experience streams provided that in addition to phenomenal overlap there is also an overlap of phenomenal property instantiation: the instantiation of the quale of the experience as of a d-note in the first experience is numerically identical to the instantiation of that quale in the second (p.106).

We should be mindful of the work that objective temporal ordering does for Dainton. Suppose I simultaneously experience an e-note following a c-note, and a g-note following an e-note, and suppose these experiences share the same instantiation of e-note experience. Dainton can say that it is because these jumbled experiences occur at the same time that they do not make for a stream of consciousness. What can Pelczar say?

In the second part of the book, Chapter six is a survey of different forms of idealism: Berkeleyan, Kantianism, Leibnizian and Millian phenomenalism. Pelczar argues that phenomenalism is the most ambitious insofar as its only fundamental posits are experience and the potential for experience. He identifies some challenges for idealism in general, and others for phenomenalism in particular, that he will address.

In chapter seven, Pelczar argues that phenomenalism is at least as defensible as the other forms of idealism canvassed in chapter six. He first argues (§7.2) that phenomenalism is not committed to the claim that physical objects are mind-dependent. He then argues (§7.3) that phenomenalism makes no more of a mystery of the fact that things hang together in the way they do than other theories. Finally, he argues (§7.4) that the phenomenalist need not say that the only things we perceive are experiences themselves.

I am particularly concerned about §7.3. Pelczar writes as though the crux of the matter is whether phenomenalism is singled out in having to reject the principle of sufficient reason (p. 131-6). But the real challenge is that the fundamental structure and dynamics of the universe according to phenomenalism is a wildly inelegant tangle: it just so happens that all of our experiences cohere just as if they were caused by physical objects in a world unified by elegant physical law, and it just so happens that all of the experiences we would have had if we had done things differently also would have cohered in this way. For this multitude of actual and hypothetical facts of experience there are no further explanations. But what grounds all of the counterfactuals? What are the invariants of the theory? How do we tell between its laws and its boundary conditions? What are its symmetries? What kind of mathematical formalism might we use to describe it fundamentally? Is the Law of Experience Pelczar discusses in chapter five really all we have to go on?

Phenomenalism also compels us to abandon mechanistic explanation as we know it. Consider poor Phineas Gage. First he has an experience as of an iron rod falling toward his head, then, experiences of stronger animal impulses than he felt before. What is the explanatory connection? On physicalist and dualist theories the explanation is that a metal bar penetrated his left frontal lobe, damaging his brain's capacity to regulate impulses. Not so for the phenomenalist. For the phenomenalist, what explanation can there be of the fact that these experiences follow those?

Chapter eight is the full presentation of Pelczar's radical phenomenalism. Pelczar builds on Mill's version of phenomenalism by making use of streams of consciousness in his specification of the relevant counterfactual claims that he uses to define physical objects. He then identifies a carefully circumscribed class of counterfactuals, the voyage-conditionals (p.151) which characterize the ways that certain streams of experience, potential experiential voyages (p. 147) would go. A physical object exists, according to the radical phenomenalist, just in case the set of the totality of potential experiential voyages is interpretable as including perceptions of that physical object.

Chapter nine is a treatment of several outlying problems for idealism, including the problem of differentiating between skeptical and non-skeptical scenarios, the problem of making sense of hallucination and the problem of making sense of imperceptible objects. Chapter ten is Pelczar's radical phenomenalist treatment of personal identity, and chapter eleven is a defense of a kind of phenomenal internalism about intentionality, which Pelczar claims allows the radical phenomenalist to avoid taking intentionality as some kind of ideological or ontological primitive.

One general worry is that Pelczar makes very substantial use of the claim that we can have experiences as of tomatoes, or as of temporal duration: his construction of the spatiotemporal world depends on it. But what is it for an experience to be an experience as of x? In his introduction he tells us that an experience is an experience as of x just in case it is "a conscious experience with the phenomenal properties (or "qualia") that are distinctive of the sort of experience that a human being typically has if he or she consciously perceives x." (p. 8). Very well. What is it to consciously perceive x? In chapter seven, Pelczar tells us that "We perceive physical things by having conscious experiences -- experiences that fit into the totality of experiences in a certain way." (p. 137). Then in chapter nine he tells us that the difference between a deceptive appearance and a perception is that an experience is a deceptive appearance of x iff "(1) it is an experience as of x, and (2) it is not best interpreted as a perception of x in the phenomenological limit." (p. 167). This looks like a circle, and it might be vicious. Pelczar is a qualia theorist, and he tells us in chapter eleven that he does not want to appeal to any primitive intentional notions. But if qualia (which aren't essentially relational or representational) don't get their content through something like tracking relations, it is hard to see how they get it at all.

A final thought: in the words of Ray Cummings (1922), "time is what keeps everything from happening all at once." To motivate atemporalism we need a conception of how it might neither be the case that everything happens all at once nor the case that things happen one after the other. But it seems to be compatible with everything Pelczar has told us about radical phenomenalism that everything happens all at once. What rules this reading out? Happily, there is plenty of time for Pelczar to tell us.


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