Sentimental Rules: On the Natural Foundations of Moral Judgment

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Shaun Nichols, Sentimental Rules: On the Natural Foundations of Moral Judgment, Oxford University Press, 2004, 238pp, $60.00, ISBN 0195169344.

Reviewed by Neil Sinclair, Bristol University


Drawing philosophical conclusions from the results of empirical science can often be a perilous business. In this book, Shaun Nichols attempts to do just this for the sphere of moral judgement. In an unashamedly interdisciplinary approach, Nichols provides a defence of a broadly Humean empirical thesis regarding the psychological mechanisms underlying our capacity for moral judgement. Support for this view comes from a wealth of psychological studies whose cast of characters (from young children to psychopaths and even Nichols' own students) makes regular appearances throughout the book. Nichols also uses empirical findings to argue against several meta-ethical theories (including moral rationalism, neosentimentalism and moral objectivism) and in favour of his own meta-ethical position (a version of moral relativism). The book is written in a breezy style more reminiscent of popular science books than the dry tomes of analytic meta-ethics. Although, as Nichols admits, it is not a scholarly resource for any of the topics discussed, it is a prime example of the virtue of interdisciplinary study: bringing insight from many disciplines to bear on the understanding of a phenomena that doesn't fit easily into any -- in this case, moral judgement. Consequently most scientists and philosophers interested in this topic will find something to engage with here.

Nichols defends two principal claims. The first is an empirical claim regarding the underlying mechanisms responsible for 'core moral judgement'. This involves the capacity to judge a distinctive class of actions impermissible or transgressive in a distinctive way. The class of actions involved are harmful or pain-causing actions, including, as a paradigm case, hitting another person. In core moral judgement such actions are considered distinctively transgressive in four ways: (i) they are treated as particularly serious, (ii) their status as transgressions is not dependent on authority, (iii) they are generalizable (if hitting is wrong in this country, it is wrong in others too) and (iv) the justification given for why such acts are transgressive is non-conventional, in this case it typically refers to welfare-based considerations ('because it would hurt'). Generalising, Nichols takes these features to define a distinction between moral and conventional judgements.

Nichols' empirical claim is that the capacity to make core moral judgements depends on two independent mechanisms: first, knowledge of a normative theory prohibiting harmful actions, and, second, an affective response to actions of that type. The involvement of the first element is required since not every harmful event that triggers an affective response is treated as a transgression (pp.14-15). The involvement of the second element is supported by two empirical sources. First, studies on psychopaths have shown that they lack both the capacity to treat harmful actions as distinctively moral transgressions and an affective response to the suffering of others (pp.17-20). Second, studies on disgust show that where subjects have an affective response to a certain type of action (in this case, disgust), they are more likely to treat norms prohibiting such actions as distinctively moral (pp.20-23). Nichols labels this the Sentimental Rules (SR) account of core moral judgement, since on this view such judgements implicate prescriptive rules backed by sentiment.

Coupled with this empirical claim Nichols also provides an empirically supported account of the nature of the affective response involved (chapter 2) and an account of why it might be the case that so many of our norms are accompanied by such affective responses (chapters 6-7). The latter is in terms of the theory of cultural evolution (pp.121-23), which, Nichols urges, would do better to take more notice of the role of affect in determining which of our ideas best survive the process of cultural transmission.

Nichols' second principal thesis is meta-ethical. He argues that a consequence of the SR account is that moral objectivism -- the view that moral judgements are true or false independently of their relations to any agents -- is false. As Nichols' puts it: "No action is wrong simpliciter. At best, an action is only wrong relative to a population -- the population of individuals that share a certain emotional repertoire" (p.185). (I shall discuss this argument in more detail below.) Nichols also holds that common-sense moral theorising is committed to moral objectivism. It follows that common-sense moral theorising is in error. However, unlike other error theorists, Nichols believes that this error can be expunged from the practice with little practical cost -- so long as the affective responses on which moral judgements depend are preserved.

In between defending his two positive claims, Nichols also uses empirical evidence to refute alternatives to each. On the empirical side, he rejects a perspective-taking account of moral judgement on the basis that the capacity for core moral judgement emerges long before the capacity to run mental simulations of the mental states of others (pp.8-11). On the meta-ethical side, Nichols uses empirical evidence to argue against the neosentimentalist view that moral judgements are judgements about the appropriateness of certain emotions (chapter 4). Further empirically based arguments are used to refute both moral rationalism (chapter 3) and moral objectivism (chapter 8 -- I say more about both of these arguments below).

Nichols' breadth of argumentation is certainly impressive -- spanning all the way from empirical psychology to analytic meta-ethics and encompassing issues in cultural studies in between. There are, however, two significant and related problems with Nichols' arguments.

The first is precision. The precise content of Nichols' own positive empirical claim is never in sharp focus. The closest we get to a precise statement of the SR account is the following: "… core moral judgement depends on two mechanisms, a body of information prohibiting harmful actions and an affective mechanism that is activated by suffering in others" (p.97). Yet subsequent remarks serve to obscure the view. First, Nichols extends this theory of core moral judgements to cover all moral judgements (pp. 25, 81-82, & 186). No empirical evidence is offered in support of this generalisation. Second, it is never explicit what the relation of 'dependence' amounts to. Nichols rejects the idea that the two conditions (normative theory plus affective response) combined are sufficient for an agent to judge an action morally transgressive (p.28). He also rejects the idea that a necessary condition for judging an action morally transgressive is a synchronic affective response to actions of that type (p.28). He seems to maintain, however, that one cannot judge an action wrong unless at some point one has had the right sort of affective response to actions of that type (pp.26-28). This may well be true in the case of core moral judgement, but simple observation serves to show that it is generally false. For example, many people judge that tax avoidance is wrong, yet not all are disgusted by it. Third, though Nichols spends some time discussing the affective response involved in core moral judgement, he gives no general account of the sort of affective response that might be involved once the SR account is extended to cover all moral judgements. For these reasons, the plausible content of Nichols' empirical view may be no more than the following: that a core group of moral judgements -- judgements concerning the prohibition of harmful actions -- are prompted in us by affective responses to such actions. This may have robust empirical support but it is not nearly as meta-ethically controversial as Nichols maintains.

This brings me to the second problem. Though the empirical evidence that Nichols presents is informative and interesting, it seldom serves to justify his meta-ethical conclusions. Nichols sometimes recognises this, and thus engages in meta-ethical argument in his attempt to refute his perceived opponents. At other times Nichols seems unaware of the deficit and consequently presents invalid arguments for meta-ethical conclusions. The persistent gap between empirical evidence and meta-ethical conclusions suggests that Nichols is hoping to add empirical credibility to his meta-ethical prejudices. This whiff of sulphur is never far from the surface. I shall discuss two examples (though I think there are probably more).

The first comes from Nichols' dismissal of moral rationalism. Nichols dismisses two versions of moral rationalism: the conceptual claim that moral judgements are a species of rational judgement and the empirical claim that human moral judgement derives from our rational faculties. Nichols' argument against the former is as follows: he asserts that the conceptual claim of rationalism is committed to internalism about moral judgement -- the view that there is a necessary connection between making a moral judgement and being appropriately motivated in some way (p.72). Internalism is then rejected because of the conceptual possibility of the amoralist -- an agent who makes moral judgements but remains unmotivated by them. The standard internalist response -- that amoralists do not really make moral judgements after all -- is rejected on the basis that if true, it would be a conceptual truth and therefore considered a platitude by those with mastery of moral concepts (p.73). But this last is shown false by empirical study -- those who understand moral concepts (or at least, Nichols' undergraduates) do not regard it as a platitude that amoralists cannot make moral judgements, thus amoralism is possible and internalism is false (pp.73-75). This argument has many flaws. First, Nichols provides no explanation (other than a reference to the work of Michael Smith) of why conceptual moral rationalists should be committed to internalism. Second, the rejection of internalism is not likely to impress many internalists. For even those, like Smith, who accept the less-than-compulsory view that conceptual analysis should incorporate all and only those things we treat as platitudinous in coming to have mastery of the concept accept that sometimes these inferential dispositions should be revised, namely when they are inconsistent with each other (Smith 1994, p.30). So the fact that Nichols' undergraduates treat it as platitudinous that amoralists can make moral judgements doesn't show that this is a platitude that should be incorporated into our analysis of moral terms -- for it may turn out that it is inconsistent with other platitudes surrounding the concept. But the most serious problem with Nichols' argument is that it is unclear why a defender of the SR account should want to reject conceptual moral rationalism in the first place. As Nichols repeatedly points out, his is not an account of the semantics of moral concepts (pp.99 & 117). Conceptual moral rationalism is such an account, so it is mysterious why Nichols should consider his view incompatible with it. In fact it is fairly apparent that conceptual rationalism is compatible with the SR account of moral judgement. The SR account says that the capacity for a certain range of moral judgements requires both knowledge of a normative theory and an affective response to actions prohibited by that theory. But it is perfectly compatible that these two are enabling conditions for a distinctive type of rational judgement, viz. moral judgement. On this view it would be a contingent fact about humans that, in general, they are only able to make a certain type of rational judgement when they have had the right type of affective response. This view is certainly not incoherent, so it is mysterious why Nichols ignores it. The realisation that the SR account is compatible with conceptual moral rationalism leads quickly to the further realisation that it is compatible with empirical moral rationalism. For if a rational faculty is simply a faculty responsible for producing rational judgements, it follows that, if conceptual rationalism is true, then so is empirical rationalism. In that case Nichols' results show that there are certain rational faculties that, in most conditions, require a certain affective response in order to be kicked into operation, but they are still rational faculties nonetheless. Once again, therefore, Nichols' argument is otiose.

The second example of Nichols' meta-ethical conclusions going beyond his empirical findings concerns the dismissal of moral objectivism. Nichols' argument here is as follows. First, he defines moral objectivism as the view that the moral status of actions depends on nothing more than how they are in themselves (p.184). He then notes that according to the SR account, otherwise perfectly rational creatures who lack the affective responses that we do (to harmful actions, for example) would make different moral judgements. Further, since according to the SR account moral judgements depend on our emotions it follows that: "there is no principled basis for maintaining that all rational creatures should have [our] emotional responses" (p.187). And from this, claims Nichols, it follows that: "no action is wrong simpliciter. At best, an action is only wrong relative to a population -- the population of individuals that share a certain emotional repertoire" (p.185). Nichols sums up the argument thus: "… moral judgements depend on certain emotions, and these emotions themselves are rationally arbitrary, so moral judgement … is not objective" (p.185). This argument fails for the simple reason that it confuses two senses in which moral judgements might 'depend' on our emotions. If the SR account is right, then (some) moral judgements might depend on our emotions in the following sense: if we had different emotions, we would make different moral judgements. But it doesn't follow that, were we to make different moral judgements, we are rationally obliged to treat those judgements as equally valid (or 'true') as the judgments we make now. In other words, it doesn't follow that moral judgements depend for their justification on our emotions. Strangely, earlier in the book Nichols is explicit in his acceptance of the claim that moral judgements do not depend for their justification on our emotions. Core moral judgements, for example, are justified by reference to welfare considerations such as 'because it hurt' (p.6). But it would presumably still hurt even if the hurt made us joyous, so the justification for the moral judgement wouldn't be removed were our emotions to be different. Thus we are under no compulsion to admit that the judgements of our hypothetically changed selves would be as valid as ours, that is, under no compulsion to abandon moral objectivism. So Nichols' Sentimental Rules account does not rule out moral objectivism in the way he thinks.

A final point to note about Nichols' meta-ethical arguments is that, for the most part, he does not provide independent reasons in support of his meta-ethical claims (independent, that is, of their supposed incompatibility with the SR account). Indeed some of his meta-ethical claims (most particularly his moral relativism) seem manifestly implausible. But this lack of independent support may in fact be an advantage. For if, as I have tried to argue, the SR account of moral judgement doesn't necessitate these meta-ethical conclusions, Nichols is perhaps best not to adopt them. That would leave the empirical claim he defends less controversial than he might have thought, but in so far as it is part of a more general understanding of moral judgement, a significant contribution nonetheless.


Smith, M. 1994. The Moral Problem. Oxford: Blackwell.