Set Theory and Its Philosophy: a Critical Introduction

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Michael Potter, Set Theory and Its Philosophy: a Critical Introduction, Oxford University Press, 2004, 360pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199270414

Reviewed by Timothy Bays, University of Notre Dame


In Set Theory and Its Philosophy, Michael Potter has given us a wonderful new book. Its core is a (slightly non-standard) development of axiomatic set theory, starting with the concept of a collection and working up through the axiom of choice and some simple cardinal arithmetic—enough to understand the statement and significance of the continuum hypothesis, but not enough to appreciate the singular cardinals hypothesis. Potter surrounds this core with a series of historical/philosophical case studies which illuminate both the development of key set-theoretic concepts and the philosophical issues raised by this development.

From a purely technical perspective, three things make Potter's treatment unusual. First, Potter allows urelements in his basic axiomatization. This is quite handy for philosophical purposes, as it lets us talk about sets of individuals—people, atoms, space-time points, etc.—without employing awkward set-theoretic surrogates. (For mathematical purposes, it's less useful; but, since it doesn't cause any technical difficulties, there's no reason to object.) Second, instead of giving us a standard development of ZFC, Potter organizes his discussion around a (nicely simplified) version of Dana Scott's theory of sets and stages. The resulting axiomatization is formally equivalent to ZFC—the only differences involve organization and order of presentation—but Potter's development facilitates illuminating treatments of some central philosophical issues. Finally, Potter waits until late in his book to introduce the axiom of replacement, and he then treats this axiom as (merely) one of several attempts at characterizing the height of the set-theoretic universe.

From a more philosophical perspective, Potter's book is noteworthy for its extensive discussion of the conceptual motivations behind our set-theoretic axioms and the philosophical issues raised by modern set theory. At the broad, thematic level, three issues receive particular attention. The first is the notion of dependence which seems to underly the iterative conception of sets.[1] The second is the issue of how well the iterative conception really supports the standard axioms of set theory—in particular, the axioms of foundation, choice and replacement. The third is the contrast between what Potter calls "intuitive" and "regressive" justifications for set theoretic principles—roughly, justifications based on working out a philosophical conception of the set-theoretic universe vs. justifications based on the mathematical consequences of adopting particular principles. Alongside these big thematic issues, Potter provides more local discussions of, e.g., the distinction between collections and fusions, the justification of the axiom of infinity, the nature of the continuum, and the (ultimate) decidability of the axiom of choice.

This, then, gives a general picture of the kind of book Potter has written. Let me say a little more about the details. In structure, Potter's book breaks into four sections. The first develops the basic machinery of elementary set theory. It begins by analyzing the general notion of a collection and by emphasizing just how few assumptions about this notion are required to generate a version of Russell's Paradox. (This particular emphasis is characteristic: the whole book is remarkably—and, in my view, admirably—attentive to the question of which bits of set theory—conceptual or axiomatic—are really needed to get particular results.) With this motivation in place, Potter introduces the iterative conception of set and provides a simple axiomatization of the iterative hierarchy.[2] He then proves basic technical results about transitivity, ordered pairs, relations, functions, etc.

On the philosophical side, this section is where Potter pays the most sustained attention to the notion of dependence which underlies the iterative conception of sets. The problems with this notion are really quite severe. Although mathematicians have a well-used stock of metaphors—temporal metaphors, modal metaphors, etc.—for explaining this notion, it's not at all clear that we can cash these metaphors out into (reasonably) respectable metaphysics. Potter's analyses of these problems—both in this section and when he returns to the topic later in the book—are clear, insightful and illuminating. Other philosophical highlights include the above-mentioned discussions of fusions vs. collections and the status of the axiom of infinity, together with nice treatments of Dummett's notion of indefinite extensibility, of the existence of the empty set, and of some issues relating to the fact that ordered pairs can be "coded" into set theory in different ways.

The second section of Potter's book shows how to develop number theory and real analysis within the set theory presented in part one. After giving a quasi-structuralist definition of the natural numbers,[3] Potter spends a chapter developing their basic algebraic properties (up through a proof that the natural numbers satisfy Peano Arithmetic) and a chapter developing their order-theoretic properties (including definitions of the ancestral, finite and infinite sets, countable and uncountable sets, and a proof that the power-set of ω is uncountable). He then turns to the real line. Reversing his previous order, he starts with order-theoretic properties and provides an explicit construction of R as a linear continuum. He then shows how to add algebraic structure to this continuum to get a complete ordered field.

I should emphasize at this point just how clear—and how clearly motivated—this whole section is. Although the material is quite technical, it's presented in a way which should make it accessible to most philosophy (graduate) students. Further, this is the only book I can think of which really explains to the layman why set-theorists worry so much about things like Souslin lines, Baire lines and Archimedean fields. At a larger level, Potter locates this section where he does (at least partially) to emphasize just how much classical mathematics can be developed using only a restricted set of set-theoretic axioms (remember: at this point, the axioms of choice and replacement have not yet been introduced). Finally, Potter adds some philosophical spice by including short discussions of the justification of induction, Skolem's Paradox, non-standard ordered fields, and the nature of visual and spatial continua.

Section three is almost purely mathematical. It provides general definitions of cardinals and ordinals and develops the basics of cardinal and ordinal arithmetic (more than you would find in something like Halmos; less than you would find in the first chapter of Jech's green book; but quite enough for most beginning philosophy students). As before, this development is clear and well-motivated, although the motivations are more technical—i.e., more purely mathematical—than those given in previous sections. My only caution about the section is this: because of Potter's delayed introduction of replacement, he's forced to adopt somewhat non-standard definitions of cardinal and ordinal.[4] This doesn't seriously affect the actual mathematics of the section—i.e., it doesn't affect the kinds of theorems Potter can prove—but it does affect the feel of many of his arguments.

The last section, section four, concerns some additional set-theoretic axioms. Replacement is introduced as one of several axioms which govern the height of the set-theoretic hierarchy (the other main ones are the previously mentioned "axiom of ordinals" and an axiom scheme of reflection, although modern large cardinal axioms do receive a brief mention). Potter then turns to the axiom of choice. He spends a chapter looking at some standard equivalents of the axiom—well-ordering principles, maximality principles, etc.—and another chapter exploring the effects of choice on basic cardinal arithmetic. Along the way, he provides short treatments of several other, interesting but non-standard, axioms: V=L, GCH, and the axiom of determinacy. He ends with three appendixes: one on the standard axioms of ZFC and two on the nature of classes and the effects—both conceptual and technical—of adding them to our basic set theory.

This last section is probably the most philosophical in the whole book. The main philosophical problem concerns the justification of the axioms of choice and replacement. There are well-known difficulties with generating these axioms from the iterative conception (for instance, the very fact that the axioms don't follow from axiomatizations of the kind Potter gives in section one). Potter provides a nice discussion of the relevant problems here, and then sketches several possible lines of response. We could replace (or supplement) the iterative conception with other intuitive conceptions of sets—say, limitation of size principles in the case of replacement. We could try for purely regressive justifications (difficult in either case, but probably more difficult in the case of replacement than of choice). Or, we could try to show that—appearances to the contrary—these axioms really do flow from a proper understanding of the iterative conception (Potter has some especially interesting suggestions on how this line might go in the case of replacement). Alongside the exploration of these possibilities, Potter provides shorter treatments of the constructible universe, of submodel versions of Skolem's paradox, of recent work on the decidability of the continuum hypothesis, and of the difference between classes and sets.

At the end of the day, who should read this book? I think it's an ideal book for mathematical logicians and professional set theorists who are looking for an introduction to the philosophical side of their subject. The philosophical parts of the book are closely tied to specific bits of mathematics, and the mathematical "payoffs" of various philosophical claims are brought out clearly. As a result, the book is unlikely to leave mathematicians with the feeling that its philosophical questions are "free-floating" or "unmotivated." Further, Potter's axiomatization is sufficiently different from standard axiomatizations—e.g., ZFC—that even technically sophisticated readers are likely to find the mathematics fresh and illuminating. For readers in this class, then, I heartily recommend the book.

I'd make the same recommendation to philosophers who have some prior background in set theory. For philosophers without such a background, my recommendation is (a little) more tentative. On the one hand, Potter's book has three real expository virtues. First, the mathematics itself is extremely clearly presented, both at the level of individual proofs and at the level of general conceptual organization. As a result, it's an easy book to learn from. Second, Potter is very good at explaining the motivations—both philosophical and technical—for various bits of mathematics, so one never has the feeling of wading through long pages of pointless technical minutiae. Finally, there's a whole lot of good philosophy and history in this book, enough to make it a rewarding read even for those who don't intend to follow all the technical details. In these senses, then, Potter's book provides a great introduction to set theory and its philosophy.

On the other hand, I wouldn't recommend Potter's book as a stand alone introduction to modern set theory. For all its virtues, Potter's axiomatization of set theory really is non-standard. This goes beyond the specific choice of axioms. Much, for instance, of his terminology is unusual (those with more standard training won't naturally follow talk about "birthdays," "histories" or "accumulations"). Further, some of the usual terminology receives unusual definitions (e.g., the previously mentioned case of cardinals and ordinals). As a result, this book—taken by itself—would ill-prepare its reader to enter contemporary discussions in the history and philosophy of set theory. So, if someone wants to use one book as a stand-alone introduction to set theory, then this book probably shouldn't be it; but, if someone is willing to use two books, then Potter's book should definitely be one of the two, and it should probably be the first one opened.

Do I have any quibbles about the philosophical side of this book? Of course. (What philosopher doesn't have quibbles about another philosopher's book?) Ideally, I'd have liked the historical sections to pay more attention to Skolem and to Weil. Also, I think that the organization of the book may have led Potter to underplay certain nice approaches to justifying the axioms of choice and replacement. I think, for instance, that replacement looks more intuitive when it's considered in conjunction with the axiom of infinity, and that regressive arguments for choice and replacement together work better than arguments for either of them by itself (because, for instance, of the nice structure they jointly put on the classes of cardinals and ordinals). But these really are quibbles. Potter has written the best philosophical introduction to set theory on the market, and there's no particular reason for him to have focused his book on the beating of my favorite horses.

[1] On the iterative conception, the set-theoretic universe is stratified into a (well-ordered) sequence of "levels." Sets at lower levels are logically prior to sets at higher levels, and sets at higher levels depend on those sets from lower levels which serve as their members. Although the historical origins of this conception are somewhat obscure—Potter provides a nice discussion of the relevant issues in sections 3.2 and 3.9—the iterative conception has now become the standard picture for working set-theorists. Among other things, it provides a well-motivated way of avoiding the classical set-theoretic paradoxes. Since collections like "the class of all sets" or "the class of all ordinals" include sets from all levels of the hierarchy, they don't themselves form sets at any level of the hierarchy; on the iterative conception, therefore, they don't form sets at all.

[2] As noted above, Potter's axiomatization is heavily influenced by Dana Scott's theory of sets and stages (best known to philosophers through the work of the late George Boolos). Potter's version, however, includes some elegant simplifications and a number of terminological felicities. In terms of logical strength, the axiomatization is essentially equivalent to ZFC minus the axioms of choice, replacement and foundation. The differences with ZFC are mostly a matter of presentation; they serve to highlight the extent to which Potter's axioms flow (or don't flow) from an analysis the iterative conception of sets.

[3] Instead of defining the natural numbers as a particular set within the hierarchy, Potter defines the more general notion of a Dedekind algebra; then, via an isomorphism result, he shows how any Dedekind algebra can stand proxy for the natural numbers.

[4] For Potter, a cardinal is an equivalence class of equinumerous sets all of which appear at the same level of the hierarchy (the first level at which any sets of the relevant size appear). Similarly, an ordinal is an equivalence class of isomorphic well-orders (again, all of which appear at the first level at which any such well-orders appear). In effect, then, Potter is using Russell-style definitions of "cardinal" and "ordinal," but avoiding paradox by cutting things down à la Scott's trick.

I should note here that, once Potter presents the axiom of replacement—or, more accurately, a slightly weaker axiom which Potter calls the "axiom of ordinals"—in section four, he does explain how to recover the standard definition of "ordinal." He also discusses the standard definition of "cardinal" in a brief appendix on ZFC.